Expressions of Judgment: An Essay on Kant's Aesthetics

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Eli Friedlander, Expressions of Judgment: An Essay on Kant's Aesthetics, Harvard University Press, 2015, 117pp., $22.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674368200.

Reviewed by Miles Rind, Boston College


As the Critique of Judgment is the most loosely and speculatively reasoned of Kant's three Critiques, so does it often attract a loose and speculative vein of commentary. Eli Friedlander's essay is a work in this vein. Readers who are drawn to Kant's text mainly by its suggestiveness and who ask of secondary literature that it draw the various strands of suggestion into a coherent picture, no matter how vague, will find Friedlander's book rewarding. But those who look to secondary literature for the discovery of cogent lines of argumentation in the text or for the resolution of interpretative perplexities will be disappointed.

The book comprises an introduction and four chapters. In the introduction, Friedlander compares the role of the power of judgment in the "Schematism" chapter of the first Critique with the central mediating role assigned to it in the third. Chapter 1, "The Analytic of the Beautiful," surveys the main points of the first 22 numbered paragraphs of the text, with occasional reference to subsequent ones: the idea of judging "aesthetically"; the idea of judging with a "universal voice"; the idea of a free harmony of the cognitive powers as a final or purposive state of mind; the idea of a "common sense"; and the idea of exemplary necessity. Chapter 2, "The Analytic of the Sublime," contrasts Kant's conceptions of the "dynamic" and the "mathematical" varieties of sublimity, and explores the relation between the merely "aesthetic" judgment of sublimity and that delusion of moral sublimity which Kant calls "fanaticism." Chapter 3, "Nature and Art," deals with Kant's puzzle of how such a thing as fine art is possible and his use of the concept of genius to solve it. Chapter 4, "Extremes of Judgment," explores the topics of aesthetic ideas and the ideal of beauty.

In the preface, Friedlander declares his central aim to be that of conveying a sense of the unity of the third Critique. By this he does not mean justifying the strong claims for the unifying character of the work that Kant makes in his introductions. Instead, Friedlander aims to make manifest a unity that, he says, cannot be "captured in a line of argument." And, indeed, he neither attributes to the text a unifying line of argument (he does not, in fact, give more than passing attention to the "Critique of Teleological Judgment," which makes up approximately half of the Critique) nor offers a central thesis or a unitary line of argument of his own.

Friedlander also remarks in his preface that "in order to maintain a pace of exposition suited to make the unity of Kant's text perspicuous, [he has] chosen not to explicitly engage the body of writings devoted to Kant's oeuvre" (x). This choice would be commendable if only Friedlander showed that he had learned from the extant secondary literature on the topics that he discusses and improved on the attempts that have been made to solve the outstanding exegetical problems that arise in them. Instead, in too many instances, he proceeds as if the problems simply did not exist or did not matter. This makes for a smooth but rather uninstructive progress through those topics.

For example, when Friedlander takes up Kant's distinction between the reflective and the determinative powers of judgment, he casually elides it into a distinction between two kinds of judgments. This is a misreading that ought by now to have been completely stamped out of the scholarly literature. As Konrad Marc-Wogau and others have been pointing out in print since 1938, the power of judgment is, in Kant's conception, both determinative and reflective in all logical judgments; it is only in aesthetic judgments of reflection that it is purely reflective. Collapsing Kant's distinction between two varieties of power of judgment into a distinction between two kinds of judgments is an error that is almost impossible to commit if one reads the text in German or at least uses the Guyer-Matthews translation, which draws a consistent distinction between judgments (Urteile) and the power of judgment (Urteilskraft). But Friedlander has chosen instead, for reasons not disclosed, to rely on the Meredith translation, in which that distinction is not explicitly made. That error aside, Friedlander's discussion of the distinction is shallow and unenlightening. The conspicuous questions of what exactly Kant means by "thinking the particular as conveyed under the universal" and what it means for either of these to be "given" or "to be found" is not allowed to complicate the discussion. Instead, Friedlander makes use of these perplexing phrases as if they were sufficiently elucidatory in themselves.

Friedlander's discussion of Kant's conception of the "disinterested" character of the satisfaction in the beautiful examines neither the complexities of the ordinary use of the word 'interest' nor the theoretical underpinnings of Kant's peculiar technical use of it, but instead proceeds with the word as if its meaning were clear and univocal. He further attributes to Kant the idea that judgments of taste are distinguished by being independent of "interest in the real existence of the object." Since Kant defines interest as a satisfaction in the existence of an object, an interest in the "real existence" of an object (the spurious qualifier in that phrase is due to the use of the Meredith translation) would be an interest in the existence of the existence of an object. The confusion here reflects Friedlander's scanting of the complexities of Kant's conception.

It is, in fact, much easier to give an account of what this book lacks than of what it offers. The best that can be said for it in the end is that it may stimulate some readers to develop their own interpretations of the text. The discussion of Kant's conception of a "universal voice" and the role of universal communicability in the constitution of the judgment of taste -- what Kant calls "the key to the critique of taste" -- is particularly clear and sensitive to the text. But this is not the sort of work that solves, or even acknowledges, a lot of outstanding interpretative problems.