Facing the Future: Agents and Choices in Our Indeterminist World

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Nuel Belnap, Michael Perloff, and Ming Xu (with contributions by Paul Bartha, Mitchell Green, and John Horty), Facing the Future: Agents and Choices in Our Indeterminist World, Oxford University Press, 2001, xvi+501pp, $55 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-513878-3.

Reviewed by Stefan Wolfl, University of Padua


"This is a book about the causal structure of agency and action. It frames a rigorous theory by using techniques and ideas from philosophical logic, philosophy of language, and metaphysics." If anything can summarize the content of a book of 500 pages then, maybe, these two sentences preluding the Preface of the book do (and they do it definitely better than the misleading blurb of the book). Facing the Future aims at developing a "rigorous" approach to agency, i.e., an approach that does not rely on "weak" (in the sense of "non-causal") conditions for agency such as intentions, reasons, and beliefs. The authors see their intellectual enterprise as part of a tradition in which action-theoretical concepts are analyzed by utilizing notions and methods of modal logic. In this respect the authors continue ideas developed by G.H.von Wright, F. B. Fitch, R. Chisholm, L. Åqvist, and F. v. Kutschera (to mention only a few names).

The book consists of 18 chapters and is divided into six parts. Part I provides a short and broadly informal introduction to the theory of a main action-theoretical notion on which the authors focus their consideration, namely "seeing to it that" (mnemonically abbreviated by "stit"). Thereby, "stit" does not stand for a single action-theoretical concept, but rather for a family of such concepts (cf. the discussion below). The first part contains a chapter in which the authors compare stit theory to other selected approaches to agency by discussing the work of G.H.v. Wright, R. Chisholm, A. Kenny, H.N. Casteñeda, and D. Davidson. One chapter in this part is dedicated to an analysis of imperatives, and one to a reconstruction of promises and word-givings within stit theory.

The topic of Part II is the foundation of the tree approach to agency. Here the authors argue for their theory of indeterminism, which can be briefly described as a combination of modal realism on the one hand and anti-actualism on the other. A more detailed description and discussion can be found below.

In Parts III and IV, further applications of stit theory are presented. The authors discuss the question of how other action-theoretical locutions such as "could have done", "might have done otherwise", "could have prevented", may be expressed by stit connectives (chapter 9). The subject of chapter 10 is the important distinction of multiple and joint agency. And chapters 11 and 12 demonstrate applications of stit theory in the field of deontic logic.

Then, in Part V, strategies are introduced. The reader finds here a series of interesting theorems about strategies, and a discussion of how the concept of strategy relates to Thomason's deontic kinematics. Finally, in Part VI, different logics of agency are presented and explored with respect to typical properties such as completeness, decidability, and finite model property. The appendix consists of a very helpful summary of fundamental definitions that are frequently used in the main text, a rich bibliography and an excellent index.

What makes Facing the Future so impressive is the fact that, and how, the authors succeed in bringing together various philosophical fields that are related to agency. As far as the tiny overview above can show, Facing the Future does not stop by simply providing a philosophical foundation of one of the many approaches to agency, the authors demonstrate rather how their approach can be used for solving problems in the philosophy of language, deontic logic, etc. In particular, the authors illustrate their theses by a plenitude of accurately discussed examples. For these reasons, Facing the Future may count as a real theory of the causal aspects of agency. And, by providing this theory, the authors develop a rich collection of philosophically interesting and original ideas.

To go now into more detail, let me first present the basic approach on which all the considerations in the book are based. The most fundamental assumption for this approach is that of indeterminism. A purely causal version of indeterminism would be the thesis that, speaking roughly, the future is not causally determined by the present and the past, or equivalently, that there are events that happen but are not causally determined by any event that occurred previously. This means that the past is causally closed - events that happened in the past are settled - but that there is an open causal future. From an action-theoretical point of view this thesis is not strong enough. An action-theoretical version of indeterminism would be the thesis that agents can influence the future, that agents can intervene into the causal flow of events. The word "can" used here has two aspects, a positive and a negative one. The positive aspect is that agents have the ability to do something that is causally effective, i.e., that agents are able to initiate causal chains. And the negative aspect is that agents also must be able to refrain from doing what they are able to do. As the authors put it: "Our project assumes the indeterminism of the causal order in which agency is embedded, it assumes that actions are based on real choices, and it assumes that choices are therefore not predetermined." (p. vii)

The merely causal version of indeterminism can be represented by tree-like structures, i.e., by structures consisting of a set of nodes (called moments) and a binary relation defined on this set, which represents the relation of being causally earlier than. This relation allows branching with respect to the future, but not with respect to the past. A full branch of the tree (called a history) represents one of the possible courses the world might take.

The next step, then, consists in assigning to each agent at each moment a set of possible choices. These choices are causally effective in the sense that, by choosing in a particular way, the agent can rule out some of the histories that are causally possible at the moment of her or his choice. Furthermore, each possible choice of an agent is assumed to be consistent with the choices of all the other agents at the same moment, i.e., no agent can prevent another agent from making one of her or his choices at this moment. By this requirement, choices of agents are real choices in the sense that the agent can choose independently of what the other agents do.

Using this approach as background, the authors define basic action-theoretical notions, in particular, different versions of stit connectives and the notion of strategy, which is fundamental for almost any theory of agency. The achievement version of stit, for example, is defined by: "a sees to it that Q" (where "a" stands for an agent name and "Q" for a declarative sentence) iff (1) a has a prior choice which guarantees that Q holds now, while (2) it is not settled at the moment of that prior choice that Q will hold now. It is worthwhile to observe that this definition relies on the assumption that all branches of the considered tree have a unique temporal order, i.e., that moments in the tree can (consistently with their causal ordering) be assigned instants.

The approach to agency presented in the book has some limitations, but these are, at least partially, due to its program. Agents in the sense of the tree approach to agency need not be thought of as persons. There is no condition in the approach that would forbid counting (real) random processes (given that there are such) as agents. Philosophers with a more traditional background may find this aspect irritating, since human agency appears to be so multifaceted that any reduction of agency to something that is indistinguishable from just chance events would seem inadequate. But this objection does not tell against the declared aims of Facing the Future, since the authors never claim to give a complete approach to human agency. The program is rather to restrict consideration to the causal structure of agency and to see which statements can be justified at this purely causal level of description. Hence, if someone misses a feature in the approach, he or she may feel invited to contribute it. However, the authors leave undiscussed the (maybe metaphysical) question of how agents bring about and realize their choices. Are choices to be considered as mental acts that cause a specific behavior, or do choices represent only uncaused actions (as physical events)? Is there any kind of mental-physical causation? In my opinion, the locution "transition from undecidedness into decidedness" used by the authors in this context (p. 212f) does not really elucidate the problem and is in danger of being (mis-)understood as presupposing mental-physical causation and as containing a questionable transition from mental undecidedness to causal decidedness.

A bibliographic remark may be in order at this point. As mentioned by the authors, the tree approach to agency was first discussed by F. v. Kutschera in his 1986 paper "Bewirken" (written in German), which generalizes an account with discrete ordering of time presented by him in an earlier paper from 1980. The main point where Kutschera's account differs from the one in Facing the Future is that Kutschera considered TxW-frames instead of history-complete trees (cf. the relevant discussion in section 7A of Facing the Future). Kutschera also provided an approach to strategies, which unfortunately is not discussed in Facing the Future. He introduced the exact semantics of a connective known as the Chellas stit in the literature, and he presented a list of valid formulae for this version of stit (in particular, an axiom expressing the independence condition; M. Xu's axiomatization of the deliberative stit in chapter 17 uses a propositional logic version of this axiom). And he discussed a connective for bringing-about that has both a positive and a negative condition like the achievement stit. Kutschera's "bringing-about" - in Facing the Future it is referred to as the deliberative stit - is related to the achievement stit in the following way: an agent a sees to it that Q if and only it was the case that a brings it about that Q holds now (where "now" refers to the time of evaluation of "a sees to it …"). Thus, the difference between these two connectives mainly consists in a change of perspective.

Some minor critical remarks may round out the picture. In chapter 1, the authors introduce the notion of a sentence being "agentive". A sentence Q is agentive for an agent a if (and only if) Q might be paraphrased as "a sees to it that Q" (where "stit" refers to the achievement version; in the stit paraphrase thesis, the authors cautiously just state one direction of the explanation, but when the concept is illustrated by examples, often both directions are used). Speaking roughly, a sentence is agentive for a if it ascribes (temporally) prior agency to a. I have two complaints about this notion. First, my impression is that the concept is too much oriented towards the past, and thus that it excludes many examples where one would be inclined to attribute agentiveness. For example, in analogy to examples discussed by the authors, "Yesterday, Andrea chose a chocolate ice cream" would be agentive, while "Andrea is just choosing chocolate ice cream" would not. The second example would be agentive only if we considered the deliberative stit instead of the achievement stit, but then the first example would not be agentive. Second, the notion of "agentive" is not able to clarify the important difference between what an agent does and what she or he brings about (where "bringing about a state-of-affairs P" means that the agent does something that causes P).

In chapter 6 the authors spend some time on arguments regarding the thesis that "history-incomplete" trees (in the literature sometimes referred to as bundled trees) are inappropriate for an approach to agency. Thus, the choice structures as described above do not contain a parameter for the set of (possible, admitted) histories. In this context it is at least surprising to see that the authors do not suffer the same discomfort (but cp. pp. 140f) in deploying as a structural parameter a set of instants, which in fact is essential for the definition of the achievement stit. Even if a tree is synchronizable, i.e., if there is a way of labeling moments with instants (in accordance with their causal ordering), this synchronization needs not be unique. Hence, which synchronization to use is far from being a trivial question. And, in reply to a remark on p. 197, it would seem that since instants (in the sense of the tree approach) and possible histories are alike in being "Very Big", the authors should complain about the former as much as the latter.

In chapter 6, the authors also argue against different versions of actualism. From the point of view of tree structures, any thesis claiming that there exists an actual history or (relatively to a given moment) an actual future might count as actualist. Without going into details, I do not think that the authors could prove the case against actualism, but I agree with them in that any such view is obliged to provide an exact and consistent representation within the conceptual framework of such tree-like structures. The interesting point here is how the authors link the problem of existence of an actual future with the discussion of what they call the assertion problem. The assertion problem arises where somebody is asserting something about the future. However, which future? It would be natural to answer "the actual future". Thus, the assertion problem seems to point to a gap for any anti-actualist view, since these lack any simple possibility of how to fill the open place in history-open sentences such as "The coin will land heads". (Obviously, satisfying the open place in this example by means of quantification over histories does not solve the problem since asserting that the coin will land heads differs from asserting that it is possible or settled that the coin will land heads.) The authors' solution consists in providing an approach to assertion that avoids exactly this assertion problem. However, it should not go unmentioned that the same problem could be restated with respect to beliefs. It would be interesting to see which solution the authors would suggest for the analogous belief problem of sentences about the future.

In Part VI, several fragments of a formal language and a formal semantics presented in chapter 8 are studied with respect to logical properties such as axiomatizability, decidability, etc. In view of the expressive power of the language considered in chapter 8, the languages considered later on seem weak, since they do not contain temporal operators. On the other hand, from a technical point of view, the methods applied, for example, in the completeness proof of an axiomatization of the achievement stit are really interesting and in any case worth studying in detail. The main problem there is to use the implicit temporality of the achievement stit for constructing a tree-like canonical structure. It is also worthwhile to observe that the tree defined in section 16E is history-complete, since the temporal order associated with that tree has a last instant (in general, history-completeness, a second-order condition, is still a gap in all completeness proofs that are related to tree-like structures).

The book draws on a series of papers published by the authors, summing up a more than ten-year period of joint research. Occasionally, this history of the book shows up in the text (for example, when concepts are reinvented several times). However, this structure allows readers to jump between different parts and chapters. All parts are readable alone, given that the reader is familiar with some basic notions (the amount of previous knowledge, of course, depends on the topic of the particular chapter). Moreover, this structure of the book enables readers from different philosophical and logical fields quickly to discover interesting ideas related to their own work. Finally, the authors always find the right balance between philosophical deliberation and logical elaboration.

To sum up, Facing the Future is an outstanding and impressive book, which is eloquently written and enlivened by its authors' sensibility for linguistic distinctions and their sense of humor. Undoubtedly, Facing the Future will become the standard for reference for all discussions related to the modal theory of agency.