Fackenheim's Jewish Philosophy: An Introduction

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Michael L. Morgan, Fackenheim's Jewish Philosophy: An Introduction, University of Toronto Press, 2013, 399pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781442612662.

Reviewed by Michael Zank, Boston University


Students of philosophy may be familiar with Emil Fackenheim as the author of a book on Hegel's philosophy of religion.[1] Students of Jewish philosophy may be familiar with different writings, such as To Mend the World[2] or God's Presence in History: Jewish Affirmations and Philosophical Reflections .[3] Are there two Fackenheims then, one Jewish thinker and the other a student of Continental philosophy? Perhaps. But Michael Morgan's approach to these two Fackenheims is to see them as intimately linked and always in conversation. Hence he can say with some emphasis that Fackenheim's attention to the Holocaust as "rupture" in history is something that Fackenheim believed ought to concern us more generally, because what ruptured here was history, not just Jewish history. In Morgan's reading, the significance of Fackenheim's Jewish philosophy is therefore eminently philosophical.

Morgan's interest in understanding the link in Fackenheim's thought between the student of Continental philosophy and the Jewish philosopher first surfaces in the introduction, where he describes how the structure of his book changed once he began writing it. It started out with questions of continuities and discontinuities in Fackenheim's thought on three major themes: revelation, freedom and selfhood, and the nature of philosophy. The question Morgan asks throughout is how Fackenheim's thought on these and other philosophical issues changed after he began taking the Holocaust seriously as a profound philosophical challenge. This turning point in Fackenheim's thought, which may be the key to understanding him, occurred in or around 1966, as Morgan shows on p. 257, in the chapter on Fackenheim's philosophical "voice."

In place of that structure, however, which foregrounded concerns of a general philosophical nature, the book ended up taking more seriously Fackenheim's understanding of philosophy as engagement or participation. Rather than merely reflecting on the ineluctability of the hermeneutical situation of human beings, philosophy-as-engagement knows and enacts its hermeneutical stance as an expression of its self-knowledge. Fackenheim is thus appropriately situated, at least initially, among those religious existentialists he most engaged with, including Kierkegaard, Buber, and Rosenzweig. But Morgan goes further. He himself wants to do more and other than to historicize Fackenheim; he wants to confront Fackenheim's voice with other voices that Morgan deems most relevant to the current philosophical conversation (see his list of names, from Habermas to Rawls, on p. 6). In short, Morgan does not wish to parochialize Fackenheim but to identify those themes and issues that most engaged him and that were relevant to him Jewishly and philosophically, namely, those themes regarding which Morgan feels Fackenheim has something to say that may be of philosophical relevance even today, whether or not they were partially or completely driven by specifically Jewish concerns or by Jewish concerns that are not at the same time general concerns.

The book is driven by the desire to retrieve Fackenheim's legacy for today (most explicitly so in the last chapter). But that kind of retrieval would need to do more than the book really does or even wants to do. It would require taking Fackenheim at his word and taking history seriously by reflecting on what has changed since 1966, when Fackenheim began to see the Holocaust as a "rupture" in history that required us to examine every received philosophical or theological notion in light of Auschwitz. While we may still feel strongly that Auschwitz was in some sense an "epoch making event" after which no faith can remain unexamined, it is no longer so simple to speak of the State of Israel as the proper "response" to Auschwitz, as Fackenheim came to emphasize after he first visited Israel in 1968. As committed as this and other readers may be to the future of the Jewish state, our support for Jewish sovereignty and military security is no longer as unproblematic as it was to Fackenheim. After the demise of the Oslo Accords we are no longer in the same situation. The religious nationalism unleashed by the "miracle" of 1967, of which Fackenheim's theologizing of Israel may be a fairly innocent but still highly passionate and influential representative, is exactly what has deprived secular Zionism of its innocence. Morgan occasionally points out that he is not interested in evaluating some of Fackenheim's more problematic claims, which may no longer sound as compelling today as they did forty years ago. But in all seriousness: to retrieve the thought of someone who came to believe that one ought to take history seriously may require us to consider whether in the meantime other "epoch making events" occurred that may force us to rethink fundamentally the ideas Fackenheim formulated when he argued for a "Jewish return into history."[4]

Morgan's restructuring of the book entailed the realization that Fackenheim had thought more deeply and generated more far-reaching ideas than we usually assume. Morgan offers his introduction, and really the book as a whole, as a genuine appreciation of Fackenheim as an important voice for those who, like himself, believe that Jewish sensitivities, concerns, and experiences (including hermeneutic experiences, such as constituted by "midrash") can be philosophical resources of considerable value, especially in the "now" created by the rupture of the Holocaust.

What I've written above is a bit at odds with Morgan's own demurral of reading pleasure. Take for example the expanded list of themes the book promises to discuss. This list includes, in addition to the above mentioned three basic philosophical concerns: "messianism in Fackenheim's reflections about the State of Israel," his "debt to Kant" and Kantianism, his "relationship to Hegel," "the role of midrash in his Jewish thought," his "philosophical voice and its relationship to his understanding of philosophy and Jewish philosophy," and "his legacy for Jewish philosophy today and in the future" (p. 5). To no one's surprise, "The result is not a systematic presentation" (p. 5). Morgan further tamps down reader's expectations by calling his focus "narrow" in that he largely proceeds chronologically, and his discussion of Fackenheim's ideas is mostly work-immanent. A page later, however, Morgan abandons his curmudgeonly stance and offers a more helpful orientation when he frames "this project as an inquiry into meaningful human life" and enumerates five principal issues that he deems "central to this inquiry into meaningful human existence" (p. 6). These are (1) the conception of the self as historically situated, (2) the problem of the apparent relativity of all truth that results from (1), (3) the possibility, despite (2), of transcendence (not necessarily in the sense of religious belief), (4) the rupture of the Holocaust, and (5) the question of norms as constituted by relationships, including the relationship with something or someone inescapable or unconditional. It is readily apparent that here (pp. 6-8) Morgan offers us the systematic core of his relatively unsystematic exposition.

The first chapter, on Fackenheim's concept of revelation, makes very clear in what sense one must regard Fackenheim as a modern Jewish philosopher. Morgan traces Fackenheim's utterings on revelation from before and after the later 1960's, when Fackenheim's focus changed from "modernity" to "the Holocaust" as the major challenge to the concept of revelation. As Morgan shows, Fackenheim's concept of revelation takes its cue from Buber and Rosenzweig. From Buber, he takes the notion of a situated self that describes the human condition, not just that of the homo religiosus. From Rosenzweig, he takes the interpretation of revelation as an event or an encounter with the divine Other, who commands us to love, a commandment to which the beloved responds in a combination of terror and joy. Just like Rosenzweig, Fackenheim limits his definition of genuine religious experience to that of the theist in relation to a personal God. If the early Fackenheim is all about the possibility of revelation in the face of modernity, the later Fackenheim substitutes "modernity" with "the Holocaust." As a result, an event that is entirely historical and contingent gains revelatory quality for Jews, i.e., the quality of something by which Jews must inexorably orient themselves. This shift to the historical plain as revelatory forces Fackenheim to abandon Rosenzweig's conception of Jewish revelation as insufficient. Rosenzweig, as is well known, understood the Sinaitic revelation to have placed the Jews in  an   a-historical relation to the Eternal One, leaving the dirty labor of redemptive action in the world to Christianity.[5] As we learn later on, the Holocaust is not equivalent to Sinaitic revelation. Rather it is an incomprehensible rupture, an act of annihilation, which must be negated by Jewish survival even if merely for the sake of survival. Jewish philosophy, pace Rosenzweig, will become activist and imbue the secular action of Jewish survival and resistance with the redemptive quality of "mending" the world (tikkun olam).

In "Selfhood and Freedom" Morgan considers Fackenheim's understanding of human agency in response to revelation. This chapter's guiding question is whether Fackenheim modified his conception of agency in response to his growing awareness of the Holocaust. But it is clear from the outset, and consistent across Fackenheim's works, that he parts company with Rosenzweig from early on when it comes to the Jewish response to revelation. Unlike Rosenzweig, who configured the Jewish response to revelation as liturgical action in perennial anticipation of the eschaton, which represents life in the presence of the Father and hence forces the Jews to live outside of history, for Fackenheim the embeddedness of agency in historical reality forces the Jew responding to the "event" of revelation to take action in the world. This, to Rosenzweig, is exactly what distinguishes the Christian response to revelation from the Jewish response. For him, it characterizes the Christian way, the march of the gospel through history toward redemption. For Fackenheim, on the other hand, the Jew responding to revelation is himself a historical agent whose Jewish response involves agency on behalf of his people. In other words, Fackenheim synthesizes Judaism and Zionism. This synthesis denies Rosenzweig's a-historical conception of Jewish existence (a conception that ennobles the experience of exile) and turns Zionism into a form of messianic action in history.

According to Morgan, the early Fackenheim's conception of the manner in which human agency is transformed into a religious response to revelation is reminiscent of the neo-Kantian conception of "self-fashioning." It is within human consciousness that the contents of Jewish history, literature, folklore, and custom are elevated to the level of absolutely binding commandments. This transformation of the products of human inventiveness into the contents of revelation is also similar to what we might find in other mid-twentieth century hermeneutical theologians, especially Paul Tillich. But there is also a Barthian (or Rosenzweigian) element entailed in it, namely, when the condition of the possibility of any human response to revelation is seen as implicit in revelation itself. Without the "event" of revelation, no answer to revelation would be possible. Revelation remains initiated by God (though possibly eclipsed by the acute absence of God in the face of human suffering), which may be another way of saying that we are conditioned and embedded beings rather than absolute selves.

Fackenheim clearly wrestled with the contradiction between two conceptions of the self: the Kantian/neo-Kantian insistence on moral autonomy that is invoked in the notion of a self-fashioning human agency, and the Rosenzweig-Barthian conception of a self "created" by revelation, a heteronomous self called forth in response to the divine call to "love me!"

The self-choosing of the situated self is neither a mere mimetic conformity with the past nor a blank-slate self-invention. Rather, it hovers between these extremes and forges a middle path between continuity and change, tradition and modernity. This is true of all selves, and Morgan describes this as a situation that is characterized by hermeneutic or interpretive moves that recognize that we are conditioned by the past, that our freedom is limited by the homology of past and present, and by a range of other considerations.

The challenge to the hermeneutical conception of situated selfhood arose for Fackenheim when he tried to articulate an appropriate response to the historical "rupture" in relation to the past that he associated with the Holocaust, more precisely with the phenomenon of the Muselmann, the en masse transformation of selves into walking dead. This accomplishment of the Nazi death camps, or rather our knowledge that this occurred, forces us to realize that every certainty, every tradition, every historical inheritance must be reevaluated. This is the force behind the "614th commandment," as articulated by Fackenheim, not to allow Hitler any "posthumous victory."[6]

While the conception of a hermeneutical and existentially situated self choosing itself describes a universal human condition, the particular imperative, as articulated by Fackenheim, is a particularly Jewish imperative, an imperative emanating from "Auschwitz" for Jews in particular. As Morgan cogently argues, this imperative does not suspend the general hermeneutical structure of the Jewish self vis-à-vis Auschwitz. Rather, Auschwitz arises as a severe challenge precisely because it puts the Jews in a situation to which they must now respond, a situation where the complete dehumanization and annihilation of the Jews was attempted. The newness of this situation requires a new response. The authentic Jewish self is compelled to choose itself in light of this event precisely because the Jewish self, like every other self, is hermeneutically situated.

We Jews cannot go on as we did before Auschwitz. Everything Jewish, every obligation and every aspect of Jewish faith, is open to renegotiation, and yet it is the fact that Jews were able to maintain their faith in and despite Auschwitz that, according to Fackenheim, confers on us the authority and mandate not to abandon the tradition. The assertion of faith, resistance, and martyrdom in Auschwitz is not meant as an empirical fact; it is beyond verification. Instead it is a metaphysical, and hence revelatory or commanding, imperative issuing from Auschwitz.

Morgan points out that Fackenheim arrived at these formulations in fits and starts, and he also reversed himself in important respects. In other words, he struggled with the inadequacy of conceptual language in general and with his own philosophical answers in particular. It is because of this limitation of philosophical language as such that Fackenheim resorts to the notion of midrash as a hermeneutically open framework of Jewish responses to revelation. This theme receives its full treatment in chapter 8.

Fackenheim's focus is on the horrors of Auschwitz: the dehumanized victim and the self-dehumanizing perpetrator. It is not clear to me, however, whether Fackenheim's wrestling with the threat to selfhood emanating from Auschwitz does not arise from a substitution or conflation of the transcendental conception of the self as the condition of the possibility of practical reason (a postulate) and the phenomenal self, the self as it appears, i.e., "personality" or "personhood." Was the former extinguished at Auschwitz, or was it the latter, when individuality and personality became dangerous luxuries to the inmate of l'univers concentrationnaire? In Auschwitz, the Nazis destroyed "the very idea of man," as Elie Wiesel wrote. They also killed millions of human beings. In between these matters of fact are the unfathomably many particular individuals, persons with names and histories who were seduced into following orders, transported, robbed, beaten, starved, enslaved, humiliated, experimented on and so forth. The reason why we are so hungry for stories and anecdotes about the appearance of glimmers of humanity among the victims and the perpetrators is because these stories attest to the fact that some human beings were able to act like human beings even under the worst conditions. This is not to speak of armed resistance or the risks people took to save others. It is to speak of the perseverance of humanity itself, which is to deny the Nazis the ultimate victory. They surely tried, but they also failed, to destroy the idea of man.

What seems broken since Auschwitz is the cultural and civilizational inventory of doctrines and opinions we have hitherto used to make sense of the human experience. This is what Adorno had in mind when he wrote that "writing poetry after Auschwitz is barbaric." For Jews this means that the Jewish inventory of doctrines and opinions must be reconsidered. For others it is their own civilizational apparatus that is in question. Was it strong enough then to inspire resistance to the forces that produced Auschwitz, or did it crumble? Is it sufficient now to inspire resistance to the same forces that produced Auschwitz, forces that, once unleashed, must forever be assumed to be at large? But I am not sure we ought to buy into this logic, at least not sight unseen. Indeed, we ought to remember that the proclamation of the "end of all tradition" and the call for a "new man" emanated from a source that also inspired the Nazis. In what sense, then, does Auschwitz confront us with a truth not already anticipated by Nietzsche? What Fackenheim wants to say, I believe, is that the difference between thinking about ethics after Nietzsche and living as authentic selves after Auschwitz is categorical. Whereas the one questions our assumptions about good and bad or good and evil, the other shows us that evil exists after all, despite, and perhaps also to some degree because of, Nietzsche.

Fackenheim's wrestling with the inadequacy of philosophy in the Platonic tradition is the subject of "Philosophy after Auschwitz: The Primacy of the Ethical". Philosophy, for Fackenheim, is a discipline of detached reflection on human experience. The question is whether the detachment or objectivity that is philosophy's hallmark is adequate to the task of representing, in rational terms, human experience, which is characterized by its "historicity." Philosophy's inadequacy is caused by the aspiration to transcend the very condition from which philosophy arises. Philosophy attempts to extrapolate from the world of human experience to a world of eternal truths, which is impossible. What the philosophical consciousness achieves, however, is that it makes us aware of our seeking of a perspective that transcends the particular and the limitations of this search. We are "in principle situated and yet able to recognize (our) situatedness. This knowledge is universal; and the person who has acquired it has risen to philosophical self-understanding" (p. 67).[7] To this definition of philosophy as reflection on the human situation a second function must be added, which prevails in Fackenheim's theological writings. Here philosophy has the task of a "sympathetic re-enactment" of the faith commitments of a believer or of the "root experiences" constituting a religious community, without regard to the truth of those commitments and experiences. Fackenheim uses this approach not just in his early theological writings, but also in the later work, including God's Presence in History, where Exodus and Sinai are described as the constitutive "root experiences" of Judaism without entering into the debate on the historical truth of these experiences. This method of describing the content of religious consciousness had been pioneered by the German Protestant theologian Martin Kähler and further developed by Rudolf Bultmann. It was in the form of Bultmann's strategy of "demythologization" that it entered the mainstream of the North American theological discourse shortly before Fackenheim began to publish more widely in the 1950s and 60s.

The chapter provides a general answer to the question of how Fackenheim sees philosophy as modified by the "rupture" of Auschwitz. Morgan suggests that, though always attentive to the embeddedness of philosophical thought in particular historical contexts, i.e., to the historicity of philosophy, the later Fackenheim believes that the goal of philosophy has changed (p. 80).

Philosophy can no longer seek comprehensive knowledge of the world and history, nor should it; what it can and must do is understand human existence in such a way that it contributes to meeting the moral challenges of living in a world of atrocity and horror. Philosophy today must be responsive and responsible to those who suffer and to those who make claims upon us for acknowledgment and concern. In so doing, philosophy and moral action become interdependent. Each is shaped by the other. (p. 80)

Fackenheim is therefore placed in proximity to Levinas (p. 80, and again later on pp. 301-302).

Fackenheim shifted from a more or less existentialist (practically situational but formally timeless) understanding of human life as subject to paradox and contradiction to a particular historical moment and its demand on us to respond collectively. Morgan compellingly traces this shift in two chapters on, respectively, Fackenheim's debt to Kant and Kierkegaard ("Fackenheim and Kant") and his debt to Hegel ("The Hegelian Dimension in Fackenheim's Thought," a pun on the title of Fackenheim's book on Hegel). The most important source for these chapters is Encounters Between Judaism and Modern Philosophy (1973). The chapter on Kant focuses on the concept of "radical evil" and includes a discussion of Hannah Arendt's book on Eichmann. Here and elsewhere Morgan goes beyond work-immanent interpretation and engages other interpretations in order to shed light on some of Fackenheim's idiosyncrasies. Fackenheim criticizes Kant's conception of radical evil as not radical enough as it seems disinterested in the kind of empirical evil that took place on "planet Auschwitz." Morgan comes to the aid of Kant by enlisting Henry Allison, Richard Bernstein, John Silber and ultimately Kant himself, who knew very well that "depravity" existed in the real world. To be sure, and Morgan shows this from later writings, especially To Mend The World, Fackenheim is persuaded of the unique depravity manifested in the Holocaust. It is this uniqueness that requires a philosophical response. Fackenheim draws on survivor testimony and descriptions of the horrors to show that this evil was unprecedented and that it is beyond human comprehension. Rather than capitulating in the face of evil philosophy, however, it is given greater urgency and redirection toward "repair" or "mending." In the chapters following, he addresses the resources available to philosophy and Judaism for responding adequately to the unique and radical evil of the Holocaust.

The first resource Fackenheim enlists is Hegel, though surely not in an unbroken or Hegelian fashion. But it is from Hegel, whose Phenomenology he first encountered as a rabbinical student at the Lehranstalt für die Wissenschaft des Judentums in Berlin in 1937 or 1938 (p. 130), that he learns how to think about the mutually constitutive relation between philosophical rationality and historical particularity (cf. chapter 7 "History and Thought: Meaning and Dialectic"). As Morgan shows, Fackenheim's abiding interest in Hegel derives from the observation that even though the unity of the Hegelian worldview has been shattered by history, and even though the place of the philosopher in the dialectic of world history has shifted from unifying principle to that of a mere "I, first and last name" (Rosenzweig), the system of German idealism nevertheless left "dialectical traces" that are useful to us (p. 161). Following the collapse of both left and right wing Hegelian schemes, there nevertheless remains the possibility of reasserting something like a "broken middle" (p. 161). Morgan also articulates why Hegel remains important even after the demise of his system: "without [Hegel] there is an ever-present temptation to avoid the secular-religious predicament in favour of either some form of scientism or narrow empiricism, on the one hand, or a reactionary neo-orthodoxy, on the other" (p. 145). The Fackenheim that emerges here, one with whom Morgan is in evident agreement, continues to be committed to at least some aspects of modernity and secularism, despite the profound rupture and despite the fact that they are no longer the comprehensive framework of philosophical thought they once claimed to be. The retrieval of both, philosophy and Judaism (see the chapter "The Midrash and its Framework"), will be fragmentary, but neither thought, nor history as such, nor Jewish particularity must be entirely abandoned if a "mending" is to succeed. In contrast to Hegel, who believed that the rupture of the spirit, once mended, leaves no scars, Fackenheim's mending proceeds without obscuring any scars (p. 291).

Next Morgan turns to "Politics, Messianism, and the State of Israel," specifically to "Fackenheim's Early Post-Holocaust Thoughts about Zionism." The chapter is intimately related to the one on Hegel in that it is while Fackenheim is working on the religious dimension in Hegel's thought (published in 1968) that he discovers the Holocaust as an "epoch making event" that must not be elided. This begins to register in speeches and articles from 1966, i.e., before the Six Day War (p. 257). Then, in 1968, he visits Israel for the first time. Until that point Fackenheim was not a Zionist. His upbringing had been thoroughly anti-Zionist, but in early writings on Buber he saw the Jewish state as, at least potentially, an important spiritual center. His concern at that point (the mid-1950s) was, in contrast to Buber, that the Jews were on the whole too materialistic and forgetful of spirituality (p. 170). Remarkably, Morgan suggests that for the pre-1970 Fackenheim, "Modern Judaism is not endangered by a lack of appreciation for worldly possessions and nature. If it is 'endangered by rootless spirituality,' which is Buber's worry, 'it is certainly no less endangered by the idolatry of the roots,' which is Fackenheim's" (p. 171).

All this changes, and dramatically so, with that first visit to Israel Fackenheim and his wife Rose undertook at the invitation of the Israeli government. Subsequently, in 1982, the family relocated to Jerusalem. Throughout the latter part of Fackenheim's career, from c. 1970 until his death in 2003, the State of Israel remained a major theme of his writings. As Morgan makes clear, Fackenheim's initial infatuation with Israel was a thoroughly romanticizing and idealising affair (p. 184). His encounter with the secular Israeli Jew as someone who combined within himself secularity and spirituality in astounding ways, his view of the IDF soldier as fighting in full awareness of a grim Jewish past (a view influenced by a letter he received from Harold Fisch in 1967) -- all this may be to some degree comparable to the encounter Rosenzweig had with Polish Jewry in Warsaw during the First World War. It was an event in Fackenheim's life. It changed his view of the vitality of a Jewish society he had never directly encountered before and that came to represent for him the ultimate response to Hitler, the collective answer to the Commanding Voice of Auschwitz, and hence a reality that, despite all fragmentation and imperfection, represented a new beginning or mending. In short, Fackenheim began to imbue the historical reality of the State of Israel with a quasi-messianic dimension.

Something Morgan mentions in passing may be illuminating. It relates to the "quasi" messianic nature of Fackenheim's conception of Israel as a response to the Holocaust. For it is the secular Israeli, not the anti-Zionist ultra-Orthodox Jew, who represents the "authentic" Jewish answer to Auschwitz. This, of course, is ironic, or rather a thoroughly Hegelian and dialectic idea: only the Jewishly inauthentic Jew represents the authentic Jewish response to the commanding voice of Auschwitz.

If this sounds strange to us today, we must remember two things. One is the mood of the time, and hence the meaning of the Six Day War, as it was experienced by someone like Fackenheim. The other is the presupposition with which Fackenheim approached and decoded his experience of the State of Israel. The mood was such that before June 1967, with Nasser's closure of the Straits of Tiran and other signs of imminent war, the Israelis had dug mass graves in anticipation of certain defeat. The victory was not only astounding and liberating, but it was celebrated as a possible condition for a final reconciliation (using the formula of "land for peace") between Israel and its neighbors. The war that had threatened Israel with extinction had turned into a messianic moment, not least through the highly fraught capture of East Jerusalem and the retrieval of the Western Wall. Fackenheim, although not present at the time, was swept up in the emotional aftermath of these events. The presupposition from which he decoded and interpreted these deeply moving and quasi-messianic events was the recovery of Auschwitz as an "epoch making event." Only from the perspective of Auschwitz was it possible and even necessary to interpret the military valiance of the IDF as an act of resistance in a direct lineage with the Warsaw Ghetto uprising. We see that Fackenheim significantly contributed to what by now has become a problematic trope in Israel-apologetics, namely, the indiscriminate identification of Israeli military action with the valiant but ultimately futile self-defense of the Ghetto fighters against the Nazis.

The chapter on Zionism is followed by "History and Thought," a consideration of what Fackenheim meant by "epoch making events." Here Morgan discusses Fackenheim's early readings of Schelling and Heidegger (the latter all-too-briefly). In a sense, this picks up the theme of revelation from earlier in the book, but in a different key. The epoch making event par excellence for Fackenheim is the Holocaust. But the problem here discussed is how philosophical thought can be affected by events at all. After 1966, Fackenheim begins to assert that thought is indeed affected by the rupture of Auschwitz, which therefore demands new forms of discourse, including new Jewish forms of discourse. Morgan considers the problem from a philosophical perspective in this chapter. In "The Midrash and its Framework: Before and After Auschwitz" he asks whether the midrashic framework survives unscathed, whether midrash can be understood and employed in the same way before and after the Holocaust. The answer here is that the theological assumptions of midrash, as radical, dialectical, or dialogical as they may sometimes appear, no longer satisfy the Jewish need for an authentic response to the absence of God in the face of six million Jews and many others butchered. To retrieve some fragments of that midrashic framework, Fackenheim draws on Wiesel and others who created what he once called a "mad midrash" that alone can serve as an adequate response that mends our broken connection with Jewish theological tradition.

Morgan reviews the entire set of Fackenheim's writings from early to late under the heading of "Finding a Philosophical Voice." The concept is borrowed from Stanley Cavell, and it focuses not so much on style and stylistic change as it sheds additional light on the changes in Fackenheim's writing from the sober and academic philosophical work of his early years to his later much more passionate, but also occasionally cryptic and ponderous writings post-1970. In between, in Morgan's patient and detailed analysis, we find a brief sequence of highly poetic and rhetorical pieces that announce Fackenheim's important discovery of the voice to which he henceforth responded: the commanding voice of Auschwitz.

There is very little Morgan leaves out (it would have been useful to have a bibliography of Fackenheim's writings).  Morgan's discussions are lucid, engaging, informative, and truly stimulating. He succeeds in bringing us into the presence of a philosophical teacher who, despite all shortcomings, gave voice to by now classical concerns of modern Jewish philosophy.

[1] The Religious Dimension in Hegel's Thought (Bloomington: Indiana University Press 1967).

[2] To Mend the world: Foundations of post-Holocaust Jewish Thought (Bloomington : Indiana University Press, 1994).

[3] God's Presence in History: Jewish Affirmations and Philosophical Reflections (Northvale, N.J. : J. Aronson, 1997).

[4] The Jewish Return into History: Reflections in the Age of Auschwitz and a New Jerusalem (New York : Schocken Books, 1978).

[5] Note that Rosenzweig used the terms “Jew” and “Christian” as ciphers for a kind of attitude to the world that becomes ritualized or configured in these particular communities. This implies that Jews may act in a “Christian” manner toward the world, though this could never be an authentically Jewish kind of behavior on their part. For this reason, Rosenzweig publishes his general political and pedagogical writings under a Christian pseudonym.

[6] P. 42 and passim, citing The Jewish Return into History, New York: Schocken, 1978, p. 22.

[7] Citing “Metaphysics and Historicity” in The God Within, ed. John Burbidge (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1996) p. 141.