Faith in a Hard Ground: Essays on Religion, Philosophy and Ethics

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G.E.M. Anscombe, Faith in a Hard Ground: Essays on Religion, Philosophy and Ethics, Imprint Academic, 2008, 273pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845401214.

Reviewed by Alasdair MacIntyre, University of Notre Dame


In 1981 three volumes of Elizabeth Anscombe's Collected Philosophical Papers were published. At her death in 2001 she had on file a considerable number of papers, either unpublished or no longer easily accessible, a first volume of which, Human Life, Action and Ethics, appeared in 2005. The editors of that volume, Luke Gormally and Mary Geach, have now put us further in their debt with this second collection. I should at once declare my interest. I wrote in support of the application for funding that made the preparation of this new volume possible. And any bad tendencies that I may have to self-congratulation have been unfortunately strengthened by the happy outcome.

This is an excellent and unusually rewarding book. It contains twenty-two papers which vary in length from one page to forty. The editors have helpfully included three papers from the third volume of the Collected Papers, so as to give a more adequate representation of Anscombe's thought on some of the topics with which she deals. Those already well read in her work will get from a number of these papers a fuller understanding of the relationship between Anscombe's Catholic beliefs and her philosophical enquiries. Both they and readers who are encountering Anscombe's writing for the first time will do well to begin by reading Mary Geach's 'Introduction', which conveys wonderfully well the temper of her mother's mind.

In subject matter the papers range widely. Five are concerned with Catholic teaching on contraception and chastity, one with the early embryo, one with the use of nuclear weapons, one with simony, one with usury. The longest paper is the text of the McGivney Lectures on sin. The shortest is a translation from Latin of a sermon delivered before the University of Oxford on the hatred of God. One paper answers the question of what it is to believe someone, another the closely related question of what it is to have faith. Three deal with common misconceptions of morality, one with moral education. Prophecy, miracles, paganism and superstition, the dangers of attachment to things, the immortality of the soul, transubstantiation, and what it is to be in good faith provide matter for yet other papers. The concluding essay is 'On Wisdom'. On every topic Anscombe has something important to say, characteristically something that badly needed saying both when she wrote and now. Cora Diamond said of her that she

has taken familiar and unquestioned assumptions and shown how far from obvious they are. Philosophy as she does it is fresh; her arguments take unexpected turns and make unsuspected connections, and show always how much there is that had not been seen before. (1979)

So it is too with these papers, whose peculiar interest lies in the way in which philosophical considerations are brought to bear on theological issues and theological on philosophical.

Consider just three examples of very different kinds. In the lectures on sin, after noting that not only actions are sinful, since there are also sins of negligence and omission, Anscombe begins from two definitions of sin: sins as behaviors against right reason and sins as behaviors against divine law. She then explains how these two definitions are related and opens up enquiries into how wrongdoing is possible, voluntariness, and God's causality and human action, concluding with a short theological treatment of man's redemption. There are on the way critical encounters with Hume, Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, and Anselm. At each stage the theological discussion is only allowed to proceed after the relevant philosophical issues have been clarified, so that one is not only introduced to each particular problem, but is also provided with an overview of the inescapable philosophical dimensions of Catholic moral theology. Each problem is well defined, so that what is at stake in resolving it in one way rather than another becomes clear. There is of course a good deal more to be said than Anscombe was able to say within the framework of these lectures, but she always takes her readers to the point at which they are considerably better placed to pose their own further questions than they would otherwise have been.

Philosophy plays a very different part in Anscombe's discussion of the immortality of the soul. In what does the spirituality of the human soul consist? Any conception of an immortal substance "is a delusive one" (71) and the kind of immateriality that thought possesses provides no basis for ascribing spirituality to the soul, let alone immortality: "there is no reason whatever for believing in a temporal immortality of the soul, apart from the resurrection," that is, the resurrection of Christ and the promise of the resurrection of the body. Anscombe adds that "there is no 'natural immortality of the soul' that can be demonstrated by philosophy" and she takes "the Christian doctrine of immortality to be the doctrine of an unending human life, happy or unhappy, after the resurrection and not the doctrine of an immortal sort of substance." (77)

Yet this raises a problem: "it is also Christian doctrine that the soul is judged at death and then suffers or is in glory till the resurrection. Must one not have a theory of how it can exist?" Anscombe's reply is to suggest that what philosophy might achieve is a cure for the impulse to search for such a theory. Catholic teaching provides no justification for any claim that "the soul has it in it to exist apart from the body" (78), and any picture that we construct would be "an idle picture," one that did no philosophical or theological work for us.

My dissatisfaction with this line of thought may be no more then a sign that I have not yet subjected myself to the philosophical treatment that would cure my impulse to think otherwise. But I remain uncured. Anscombe's initial arguments follow Wittgenstein's closely. "Thinking is not an incorporeal process which lends life and sense to speaking" (1953). Indeed, but, as Anscombe remarks, although the concept of 'thought' is one that we all possess, it is difficult to give a satisfactory account of it and no one as yet has, although not for lack of trying. So perhaps we need to start out all over again, first rereading Plotinus and then taking encouragement from the recent plague of wrongheaded accounts of thought advanced by philosophers so anxious to make connections between thoughts and brain states in the light of recent biochemical and neurophysiological discoveries that they lose sight of thought itself.

On theological issues of course Anscombe's views were in important respects at odds with Wittgenstein's and even more so with those of some of Wittgenstein's followers, views which she criticizes at the conclusion of her paper on "Paganism, Superstition and Philosophy." Wittgenstein said to Drury -- Anscombe does not cite this -- "The ways in which people have had to express their religious beliefs differ enormously. All genuine expressions of religion are wonderful, even those of the most savage peoples" (1981). It is the spelling out of this inclusive view, which Anscombe ascribes to some of Wittgenstein's followers, that she identifies as a modern philosophical version of a belief central to ancient paganism, a paganism that bred hatred for the exclusiveness of Jews and Christians.

Nothing that I have been able to say in this review adequately conveys the richness of these essays. They need to be read.


Diamond, Cora (1979), 'Preface' in Intention and Intentionality: Essays in Honor of G.E.M. Anscombe, Cora Diamond and Jenny Teichman (eds.), Brighton: Harvester Press, xiii-xiv.

Drury, M. O'C (1981), 'Some Notes on Conversations with Wittgenstein' in Recollections of Wittgenstein, Rush Rhees (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 76-96.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1953), Philosophical Investigations, tr. G.E.M. Anscombe, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 339.