Faith in Politics: Religion and Liberal Democracy

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Bryan T. McGraw, Faith in Politics: Religion and Liberal Democracy, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 320pp., $33.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521130424.

Reviewed by Mark N. Jensen, U.S. Air Force Academy


Where the dominant theme of twentieth-century political theory was the interaction between ideology and politics, it is becoming increasingly clear that the dominant theme of twenty-first-century political theory is the interaction between religion and politics. Bryan McGraw's book, Faith in Politics: Religion and Liberal Democracy, is both a thorough introduction to the issues here as well as a carefully developed attempt to assuage the worries that many modern citizens and scholars have about the resurgence of religion.

McGraw is among the scholars who do not regard the resurgence of religion as marking the return of barbarism, the end of democracy, or the death-knell of our Enlightened and tolerant age. Quite the contrary: McGraw argues that religious citizens can and often do contribute positively to liberal democracy. Taking on the most challenging version of this task, McGraw concentrates on "religious integrationists". These citizens

avoid the theocratic mistake by refusing to conflate the worlds of faith and politics without entirely separating them either. They accept and are willing to work within established political avenues and eschew the idea that the state should be in the business of securing strictly religious goods. In the democratic context, non-theocratic integrationism would accept 'the requirements of constitutional democracy … defined as a set of political institutions and practices embodying the principles of popular, representative, and limited government under the rule of law' (p. 21).

Theocrats, on the one hand, can be justifiably suppressed in liberal democracy, as they seek to overthrow the democratic regime. On the other hand, non-integrationist religious citizens, who subordinate their religious views to their political views or radically distinguish these areas, present little problem, as they always prioritize democracy and its regulative principles. It is the religious integrationist who presents the problem: she is committed to constitutional democracy, but (i) she offers reasons for her views grounded in religious doctrine; (ii) she eschews modern pluralist moral and social conventions, living her life and educating her children through institutions that insulate and restrict; and (iii) she seems to be intolerant of others who don't share her religious views.

McGraw's target is what he calls the "consensus view", supported principally by J├╝rgen Habermas, John Rawls, and Robert Audi. According to the consensus view, if religious citizens can't properly bracket their religious lives and beliefs in democratic society, we're on a short path back to the Wars of Religion. McGraw's line of response is an attractively simple two-step. First, he works through these three worries (the problem of public reason in Chapters 2-4, the problem of autonomy in Chapter 5, and the problem of tolerance in Chapter 6), demonstrating that the moral and philosophical justifications for these worries are either mistaken or reducible to sociological justifications. Next, McGraw uses four cases studies to show that the sociological justifications tapped to support the worries here are not supported by empirical research. The cases studies are drawn from Europe, roughly 1870-1930, and focus on religiously-based political parties: (i) the Dutch Calvinist Anti-Revolutionary Party, (ii) Belgium's Catholic Party, (iii) Germany's Center Party, and (iv) Austria's Christian Social Party. In each case, religious integrationist citizens are politically active -- sometimes even in control of government -- and yet the nations in question do not devolve into theocracy. In fact, liberal democracy appears to flourish, at least in part, as a result of the activities of these religiously grounded political parties (at least until other events, such as the rise of the Nazi party, intervene).

At this point, it's worth pointing out that from the beginning, McGraw is explicit in his intent to synthesize the arguments of political philosophy and the deliverances of empirical political science. While he is not the first contributor to attempt a synthesis of this kind (Paul Weithman's Religion and the Obligations of Citizenship is an earlier example), McGraw's work is an excellent example of how this can be done well. Especially striking is that his treatment of philosophical arguments is just as nuanced and adept as his treatment of empirical social and political research. In our ghettoized academic landscape where scholars rarely venture outside their home disciplines, it is rare to find an individual who can carefully weave a clear line of argument through the terrain of philosophy, political science, sociology, and law.

Returning to the argument of the text, the central aim of McGraw's investigation is not to show that liberalism's various encroachments into religion and religious life are violations of religious liberty (though he does point out these encroachments), but instead to show that the justification for these encroachments -- namely, the dangers posed by religion -- is not only overblown but is in fact a fundamental error. Religious institutions, even religious political parties, can and have contributed positively to the stability and flourishing of liberal democratic political institutions. In light of these facts, McGraw suggests two areas in which liberal political theory should be adjusted: the theory of political legitimacy and the account of civic virtue.

With respect to legitimacy, McGraw argues that we would be better served regarding political legitimacy as a characteristic of democracies that is established through a fair contest among political parties committed to a constitutional consensus, rather than as a starting point for deliberative engagement. On the latter view, legitimacy is grounded in a reasonable overlapping consensus, in which the kinds of reasons that we may offer in the public forum are restricted by ideals of public or secular reason. In this way, McGraw regards Rawls' ideal as a step too far: religious integrationist citizens and the democratically beneficial possibilities engendered by their participation are unjustifiably and unnecessarily restricted in a reasonable overlapping consensus. As far as civic virtue is concerned, McGraw argues religious integrationist institutions (e.g., sectarian schools, newspapers, unions, and parties) have proven effective at cultivating precisely the civic virtues that liberal democracy requires of its citizens in order for political institutions to flourish. The consensus view that civic virtues must be inculcated by political institutions (e.g., public schools) is itself illiberal and, in actuality, undermines the effectiveness of those institutions in civil society that are better suited to cultivating the virtues.

From the beginning of the book, the careful reader will find herself regularly alarmed by the unrestricted nature of McGraw's generalizations about the possibilities for religious participation in democratic politics. In his conclusion, for example, he writes that, "Religion's political participation should be welcomed, maybe even encouraged, along the same lines as other groups." (265) As a matter of logic, four examples, all drawn from the same time period and within the same faith-tradition, do not justify an unrestricted generalization across faith-traditions and across the ages. But it is likely that McGraw does not intend these claims to be understood as unrestricted generalizations. In the conclusion, he assesses his claims against two specific contemporary concerns about religion and politics -- the "Christian Right" and political Islam. While he argues that in both contemporary cases his conclusions are still justified, he is careful to note limitations and differences. I suspect that what a philosopher might take to be sloppy logic is probably better read as a stylistic difference between the prose of philosophers and the prose of political scientists. (The reader should also be warned that an analogous habit infects McGraw's exposition of thinkers whose views have evolved over time. Just when you think that McGraw has failed to engage with the most recent version of Rawls, Habermas, etc., he comes around, without warning, and takes up the update.)

Stylistic differences aside, however, I wonder whether McGraw's argument actually demonstrates as much as he claims for it. The vertically integrated clusters of religious institutions that lie at the heart of each of McGraw's cases succeed in their times and places, it strikes me, in no small part because of the parliamentary nature of their political systems. In other words, in the kinds of multiparty systems that characterize parliamentary democracy, the corresponding social and political networks tend to be arranged much more tightly around distinctive comprehensive and partially comprehensive doctrines. Citizens aren't searching for a grand consensus (or even a reasonable overlapping one); they recognize a multiplicity of competing interests connected to political parties and their supporting social and economic interests align along a much tighter set of coherent doctrines and practices. They see democratic politics as horse-trading among these interests. Insofar as no political party has a clear majority, the executive elements of government are cobbled together by parties that form majority partnerships -- sometimes purely on the grounds of expedience. In a political world of this kind, it seems that citizens will be much more tolerant of publicly-supported comprehensive views than in a world where political parties aim to be "big tents" and the electoral victor takes all. McGraw is not ignorant of this concern (see p. 291), but it seems to me that a more restricted generalization, namely, that religious integrationist citizens support democratic political institutions best under conditions of parliamentary democracy, is better justified by his line of argument. A more thorough investigation of this more specific claim might be a novel and interesting extension of McGraw's intriguing project.