Faith, Reason, and the Existence of God

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Denys Turner, Faith, Reason, and the Existence of God, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 292 pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521602564.

Reviewed by James F. Sennett, Lincoln Christian College and Seminary


Can we prove the existence of God? As anyone acquainted with contemporary philosophy of religion knows, the apparent simplicity and straightforwardness of this question is deceptive. Many subsidiary questions must be asked before any informative answer is forthcoming. Chief among these questions are: (1) What do you mean by "prove"? (2) What do you mean by "God"? and (3) Prove to whom?

While Denys Turner touches somewhat on the first of these clarifying questions and deals in some detail with the second, it is really the third that is central for understanding his project. And the answer he provides to this question will be surprising to many -- Turner is primarily out to show that the existence of God can and should be proved to those whose lives are dedicated to the study and explication of things theological. Says Turner, "Theologians in the main seem to think the proposition to be beyond question that the existence of God cannot be proved, on any defensible account of rational proof" (ix). In fact, to assume that proof is possible is understood to be in direct contradiction to the whole idea of faith. Turner's book is one large, complex, and intricate argument that, from the standpoint of faith, there is very good reason to expect that rational proof of God's existence be forthcoming. The contemporary conception that such is impossible -- born in Kant, weaned by Nietzsche, and blossoming into full maturity in Derrida and the postmodernists -- gets something very wrong both about the nature of faith and about the nature of reason. It is Turner's purpose to return us to an orthodoxy that will liberate us to understand and celebrate their true nature and relationship.

It will be helpful to have terms to refer to these opposing views that proof of God is possible and that it is not, as well as to those who hold them. Turner nowhere offers such terms. So for lack of more promising alternatives I will refer to the former view as "natural theology" and those who hold it as "natural theologians," and to the latter view as "fideism" and those who hold it as "fideists." It is important, however, to remember that my usage of these terms is restricted to the narrow confines of this distinction and carries no further connotations for the many issues that often divide those who might wear these labels in other contexts.

A great deal of Turner's argument focuses on the thought of Thomas Aquinas. He concentrates here because of his amazement at the extent to which fideists appeal to Thomas for support of their position. So, while his primary thesis is that the nature of both faith and reason support natural theology, there is a secondary thesis not far below this first tier -- viz., that the primary thesis is not only Turner's but Thomas's as well.

The first of the book's three parts (chs. 1-6) is entitled "The 'shape' of reason." Under close scrutiny here is the medieval contrast between the cataphatic and apophatic dimensions of theology -- i.e., "between the necessity of speech about God and its equal deficiency" (48). This contrast concerns the long-recognized theological paradox that, on the one hand there must be some knowledge of God in order for faith and theology to exist, and on the other hand that God, as wholly other, cannot be known for lack of any sufficient reference point. It is easy to see why this distinction is foundational to the debate between natural theology and fideism. Those who would argue for natural theology seem to be flirting with the heresy of what Heidegger labeled "onto-theology" -- the view that there is a commonality between the nature of God and the nature of humanity that would provide the basis for rational knowledge of God. The shadow of the threat of onto-theology hangs over this entire book. Thus another secondary thesis can be identified -- that natural theology can be defended without falling into this (supposed) heresy.

It is at this point that Turner's first section earns its name. Turner argues for a paradoxical pull in reason, similar to that of the cataphatic/apophatic paradox in faith. He argues on the one hand (in admittedly Aristotelian fashion) for the inescapably immanent nature of reason, grounded in the animality of human beings. Human beings could not be animals at all without being rational animals. On the other hand, he notes the obvious self-transcendent nature of reason, and argues that it necessarily points us beyond itself to some dimension of knowledge and reality about which it can tell us only of its existence, not of its nature. (Turner calls this feature of reason its "sacramental cast.") This, Turner argues, closely parallels faith's ability to inform us clearly of God's existence but unclearly at best of his nature.

The second section of the book (chs. 7-9) is entitled (rather unhelpfully) "Univocity, 'difference,' and 'onto-theology'" (the embedded scare quotes are original). In the first section Turner set up reason as potentially capable of bridging the gap between human knowledge and divine nature, but in this section he takes care to note just how big the gap appears to be, and what a formidable task reason has before it. This section is quite charitable to Turner's interlocutors, presenting a strong case for fideism that enlists such remarkably strange bedfellows as Duns Scotus and Jacques Derrida.

Scotus argued against Thomas's doctrine of analogical language in reference to our knowledge of God. After all, any argument whose terms are used univocally in the premises and analogically in the conclusion commits the fallacy of equivocation and therefore could never be valid. Hence, if our knowledge of God could only be analogical, we could have no rational knowledge of him. Scotus, of course, was no fideist -- he believed that much knowledge of God was possible through reason. His contention with Thomas was that that knowledge had to be univocal, not analogical, in nature. Nonetheless, his arguments have been used to refute any attempt to use Thomas's theories about analogical knowledge of God to bridge the cataphatic/apophatic gap.

Derrida is elicited to demonstrate just how wide the gap is that reason must cross. Derrida argues that the primary function of language is not in the identification of similarity and resemblance, but of contrast and difference. The very nature of language requires that its foundations, if any there be, be foundations of difference -- either of one ultimate and indefinable difference or of an indefinite multiplicity of differences that exasperate and overwhelm us in their variegation. Neither alternative would help the cause of natural theology, since any foundation there would need to be one that bridged gaps, not one that ended in gaps as the nature of all reality.

The final section (chs. 10-13) is entitled "Inference and the existence of God." Here Turner presents his Thomistic case for natural theology without onto-theology. The first stage of this case is to defend Thomas's doctrine of analogy against the attacks of Scotus. Turner points out that the fallacy of equivocation is not committed simply because the terms in the conclusion are not used univocally. This assumption itself commits a fallacy -- the fallacy of the false dilemma. It assumes that the only alternative to univocity is equivocity.

The fallacy of equivocation is committed when the terms in the premises and the conclusion are not really the same words at all Ð they are mere homonyms, with no overlapping meaning relevant to the inferential force of the argument. Such is not the case when a conclusion term is used analogically. The analogical meaning of a term is a semantically augmented usage. It does not say something completely different from the original, but something more, something greater, something that can be grasped to some degree but never fully comprehended. And this grasping is possible only because of (1) the expanded notion of reason developed in the first section of the book and (2) the semantical relationship of the analogical term in the conclusion to its counterpart in the premises. Hence, the fallacy of equivocation does not apply -- the inferential significance of the terms in the premises is preserved in the conclusion.

The significance of this victory for the Thomistic doctrine must not be overlooked. As noted above, analogical inference is possible only because of the tension between reason's essential immanence and its self-transcendence. Furthermore, by its very nature analogical inference both embraces the possibility of true knowledge of God and blocks off forever the possibility of exhaustive knowledge of God. So it seems that we can acknowledge the power of reason to bring us some knowledge of God without assuming that such knowledge comes from a commonality of being with God. It is grounded, rather, in the self-transcendent quality of reason -- its power to point us beyond itself and ourselves to something that we know must be there, though reason itself can tell us little more about it.

But what exactly is it that we can know about God, and how exactly does this knowledge escape the threat of onto-theology? Here we turn at last to the one central question that bridges the cataphatic/apophatic gap -- the old philosophical/theological chestnut, "Why is there something rather than nothing?" Contemporary atheology does not attempt to argue that "something rather than nothing" has a naturalistic explanation so much as it dismisses the question as nonsensical. In fact, the question is not simply incoherent -- it is dangerous and unfair, like the old trap question, "Have you stopped beating your wife yet?" Even to acknowledge the question's implication -- that "nothing" is a genuine alternative -- is to admit that the existence of anything at all is a radically contingent fact and could only be the result of creation. Hence to acknowledge the question as coherent is to endorse a specific answer: "Because someone created it."

But why would this be reason to refuse the question as incoherent? Only if, Turner contends, we have already concluded that inference from nature to God is impossible -- only if, that is, the question has already been begged against the natural theologian. Once the question is allowed to remain open, we see that it is reasonable to assume that the question may well be answerable. And if it is, it admits of only one answer -- one that reveals the existence of God, even if it can reveal nothing more than that. At this point cataphatism can lovingly and gladly give way to apophatism, reason give way to faith.

This book deals in great length and depth with very sophisticated elements of medieval theology and philosophy and relates them to very large themes of contemporary theology and its roots in post-Kantian continental philosophy -- areas in which, across the board, I am anything but expert. Therefore I will waste neither my time nor the reader's in any attempt to engage Turner critically on these points. What I wish to do, rather, is to return to the subsidiary questions I raised in my first paragraph and use them to relate Turner's work to much of what is going on in contemporary analytic philosophy of religion.

Reading this book as an analytic philosopher led me to several confusions about Turner's project. These primarily centered around the third of those clarifying questions: "Prove to whom?" Contemporary analytic philosophy of religion is still very largely a battleground between theists and atheists who both admit the intelligibility of questions about God's existence and the theoretical possibility of natural theology. Turner's work is developed entirely against a background that presupposes neither of these. So my honed tendency to read any discussion of natural theology in light of this analytic debate often led me to think that he was missing obvious retorts, cutting his interlocutors off far too short. This is not a criticism in any way -- books can only have so broad a focus -- but rather a warning to those who would read from the same perspective I brought.

Another confusion that arose from my analytical background has to do with the first of my questions: "What do you mean by 'prove'?" Turner speaks constantly of "demonstrative proof" or "demonstration," and is somewhat justified in doing so. After all, the kind of natural theology argument he has in mind is a deductively valid inference to the existence of God from true premises. However, such a conclusion will have been demonstrated only to those who are willing to accept the premises as true. It is for this reason that much of recent discussion in analytic circles has focused on the nature of rationality and epistemic justification, and whether or not there could ever be a valid argument to God's existence from premises that all who consider them would be compelled to accept as true on pain of irrationality (a view sometimes referred to as "strong natural theology"). While the idea of a viable natural theology is alive and well in contemporary analytic philosophy, almost no one is advocating the strong variety. The discussion centers more on the claim that certain arguments can provide epistemic justification for theistic belief for those in specific (and philosophically legitimate) cognitive situations (what is sometimes called "modest natural theology").

Turner's project, likewise, is clearly one in modest natural theology. He speaks of the contention that proof of God's existence cannot be forthcoming from nature, not as irrational, but simply as "clearly contestable" (253) -- it is possible that one rationally disagree with it. In other words, a successful natural theology argument will merely carve out evidential room for rational belief in God; it will not compel it of all who consider it, nor close the door to any possible rational atheism or fideism. It is for this reason that his constant use of terms like "demonstrative proof" is confusing and would likely be considered by many as disingenuous. He supports nothing close to strong natural theology, but such terminology would imply to many that this is his intent.

Seen as an exercise in modest natural theology, Turner's book is a worthy and welcome contribution to the discussion. It is one that can supply the careful analytic reader with a great deal of medieval, theological, and continental grist for the contemporary philosophical mill. In particular, his defense of Thomas as a bridge spanning the cataphatic/apophatic gap is worthy of careful study on its own. The book would make very useful supplemental reading in graduate level classes on a variety of topics, and a welcome addition to the bookshelf of most philosophers of religion, theologians, and medievalists.

My only real complaint about the book concerns Turner's writing style. His sentences are, in the main, unnecessarily complex in syntax and structure. The following sentence is not atypical: "On account of which, it seems to me that at the theological core of the case for saying that there is some imperative of faith which requires the possibility of a rational knowledge of God is a Christological consideration, a consideration which Christology as such demands precisely because of the need to read a doctrine of creation and a doctrine of Christ in terms of mutual dependence, and certainly not, as in chapter 1 we noted some to suppose, as if threatening each other in terms of mutual exclusion" (255). Negotiating several such sentences per page for over two hundred fifty pages left me exhausted and frustrated, and sounding the battle cry of Strunk and White's famous Manual on Style: "Simplify! Simplify! Simplify!"

But for the reader willing to navigate the murky waters of Turner's prose, the intellectual rewards are great indeed. I have found myself thinking and talking about the ideas in this book with surprising frequency in the days since completing my reading. And that is the highest compliment I can pay to any author.