Family Values: The Ethics of Parent-Child Relationships

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Harry Brighouse and Adam Swift, Family Values: The Ethics of Parent-Child Relationships, Princeton University Press, 2014, 216pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691126913.

Reviewed by David Archard, Queen's University Belfast


As its ‘Acknowledgments’ wittily recognizes, this book has been long in gestation and is the product of an extended transatlantic marriage of minds. It is the completed statement of a view that in its essentials has been for some time known to those working in the area through a number of key published articles. In consequence, already prior to its publication in book form this view has been much discussed and is highly influential.

The book starts from the problem famously expressed by John Rawls in the form of a clearly rhetorical question, ‘Is the family then to be abolished?’ The problem is that the existence of the family seems to be in ineradicable tension with those values liberals espouse, namely social justice and individual autonomy. Parents bequeath to the children in their care not only competitive advantages (and disadvantages), but views and outlooks that may hobble their eventual free choice of a life.

The problem for justice was, early on, neatly summarized by James Fishkin in the form of a ‘trilemma’: liberals are committed to three principles that cannot all simultaneously be realized. These are the rights of parents to choose for their children; a principle of equal opportunity; and a meritocratic principle governing the distribution of offices and jobs on merit. Fishkin thought the trilemma irresoluble, and others have tried to find a way out of the problem by the abandonment or trimming of one or more of the principles. It is nearly always the family that seems most in danger on these approaches

Harry Brighouse and Adam Swift offer an account that promises liberals relief from the problem. It does so by defending a view of what it is that makes the family valuable whilst at the same time — and in the name of the family’s value — constraining the discretionary rights of parents in respect of their children. Brighouse and Swift proceed by identifying the problem and, first, explaining how exactly parents may bequeath advantage to their children. Here the interest lies in the fact that children competitively benefit not merely from the inheritance of wealth and status (the conventional source of radical critiques of the family), but also and significantly from the parenting of their guardians. Better parents make better, more successful children. This is important not just because it is harder to regulate the ways in which such advantage is conferred, but also because whilst there may seem something unfair about children gaining riches they themselves did not earn, it seems odd to think it wrong that adults should exercise their innate and developed talents when these lie in the sphere of rearing.

Second, Brighouse and Swift spell out what equality of opportunity means and requires. Here their discussion is illuminating and of high philosophical value. However, third, the meat of the book lies in its ‘dual interest’ account of the value of the family. Many have been prepared to defend the family inasmuch as it protects and promotes the interests of children. Brighouse and Swift argue that adults have an interest in being parents and that this derives from the value of what is importantly a fiduciary relationship of care for those, their children, who are vulnerable and dependent. The nature of the parenting relationship is unique and that means that its value cannot be substituted through the enjoyment of any other relation.

Fourth, Brighouse and Swift argue that much of what liberals as egalitarians and defenders of individual autonomy find objectionable about the family can be avoided precisely by insisting that only what is necessary to secure the value of the parent-child relationship is permitted to parents. More than some liberals would sanction is indicated, but significantly less than is required to make Rawls’ question non-rhetorical.

All of these claims are defended with great philosophical intelligence, with well-constructed arguments, with a sure feel for the facts of family life (personally acquired and empirically researched), and with careful qualifications and clarifications — all very evidently the result of the extended pre-history of the book’s publication and the discussion in many places of its major assertions.

Before turning to some critical comments it is worth being absolutely clear what the book is trying to do and what it is not doing. One could ask several normative questions about the family. In the present context three are salient. The first is why there should be families, or, in other words, why anyone should be permitted to act as a parent. The second is that of who gets to be a parent, and the third is that of who gets to be the parent of some particular child.

Brighouse and Swift are mainly concerned with the first question and least concerned with the third question, except inasmuch as they doubt that biological provenance — being the progenitor of a child — gives an adult a decisive claim to be the parent of that child. They thus offer some responses to arguments that purport to show that a progenitor has a right to a child. Otherwise they principally stick to the principal issue of ‘whether there should be “parents” at all’. It is, on their account, ‘a separate and further question which adults should parent which children’ (p. 49).

In respect of the second question their view is, roughly, that those adults who are willing to and ‘good enough’ to parent can be parents.

Here follow some critical thoughts about key claims in the book. They are intended less as decisive objections and more as requests for clarification. First, a dual interest account might suggest that circumstances and arrangements can be evaluated in terms of two sets of interests that may need to be balanced against one another. However the Brighouse and Swift version of a dual interest account is different. The interest of the parent in caring for a child is just an interest in forming and developing a relationship that is in the interest of the child. There is thus, as they say (p. 94) a ‘deep harmony’ between adults’ and children’s interest in the matter of child rearing. Elsewhere they speak of a ‘happy congruence’. Now this is in itself not a problem. It may indeed be that, again as they say, this harmony or congruence tells us something important about what it is to be human.

However sometimes it helps to evaluate the weight of some set of interests to know how they fare in any conflict with another set of interests. We could, for instance, measure this parent’s interest in looking after some particular child against the interests of that child in being cared for by this parent. Indeed that is precisely what is done in custody disputes. But remember this is a way in which one might answer the third question identified earlier. Brighouse and Swift think that question to be a ‘separate and further’ one from that with which they are principally interested. Indeed it is not even clear this further question is one that is amenable to a dual interest approach, or that Brighouse and Swift would themselves favor such an approach.

We are left then with a dual interest approach in which the parental interest essentially over-determines the normative pull of the children’s interests. These latter might be enough on their own to justify the family. However, what the existence of an interest in parenting supplies is a reason, on behalf of those who act as parents, as to why the liberal society should accord them a right to do this.

It matters then what kind of interest it is. Brighouse and Swift insist not only that it is a distinctive and non-substitutable interest, but one that is, like all interests that do proper moral work, objective and real. In short, the interest is not just a matter of what adults want or feel or believe makes their life go better.

Brighouse and Swift are clear that the relationship a parent can have with its child is sui generis and that its enjoyment is a real contribution to his or her well-being. At the same time they concede (p. 100) that not everyone desires to have children and that the absence of such a desire is not evidence of a failing to know what does, as a matter of fact, contribute to personal flourishing.

I find the conjunctive claim that parenting is objectively valuable but not universally valued where such non-valuing is not erroneous to be prima facie odd. It is odd to say, as they do in their Conclusion, that family relationship goods ‘matter for everyone’ and that these goods are proper distribuenda in a full theory of justice. What are distributed in Rawls’ theory, for instance, are primary goods that any rational person may be presumed to want. But not every rational person does want the family goods.

But the full implications of this conjunction may lie elsewhere. Allow that children are public goods and, as such, goods for both parents and non-parents. Consider then that liberal states subsidize parenting through free or supported education, health resources for prospective parents and their children, parental leave, family support payments, and much else. Such subsidies are supported by the taxation of both parents and non-parents. Now, either Brighouse and Swift can offer a perfectionist defense of this universal taxation to support what all ought to desire, namely parenting. Such perfectionism would be odds with some of their liberal commitments. Or they owe an explanation of why those who do not want to parent should not have a claim to be excused from paying for others’ parenting, or a claim to be subsidized in those non-parenting activities that they may find valuable and a contribution to their well-being.

In the third part of the book Brighouse and Swift offer an account of the scope of parental rights. This is given in terms of the value of the parental relationship. Parents may do for their children what realizes the distinctive value of the parental relationship. This allows Brighouse and Swift both to defend the family in liberal terms but significantly also to constrain those effects of parental choice that seriously worry the liberal. In their own simple terms a parent may read to his child at night where such an activity confers some advantage on that child not coming to the child whose parents do not share such time with their children, but they may not make bequests of significant income and property to their child. Both may transmit advantage but only the first is needed to yield the relationship goods that justify the existence of parental rights.

The objection to inequality-producing parental activity is not that it produces inequality but that it does so and is not needed for the parenting to have its distinctive sui generis value. One concern then is how the distinction between permissible and impermissible parental activity is characterized. Across several pages (132-37) the distinction in familial relationship goods yielded by different kinds of activity is variously described as one between ‘core’ or ‘necessary’, on the one hand, and ‘sufficiently weighty’ or ‘more important’ on the other.

The point to be made here is that the first formulation of the distinction is one of mutually exclusive categories, whereas the second is scalar and applicable to all goods. Thus whereas a parental activity productive of significant inequality is permissible if it yields ‘core’ or essential relationship goods, it may not be if it produces such goods as are only more weighty or important than others. This is because once the talk is of weight and importance we ought to be able to balance the goods of a parental activity against the degree of inequality it produces.

The overall point of Family Values — and where it assumes such enormous importance in any debate about the role of the family in a liberal society — is that it offers the promise of a way out of the Fishkin trilemma. A liberal egalitarian can have her familial cake and enjoy its eating. It matters then how exactly the avoidance of an irreducible conflict of values is avoided. Brighouse and Swift offer comments (pp. 44-45) that merit expansion and elucidation.

One approach is to acknowledge the conflict of values and either give one lexical priority or offer a weighting of the values that permits an all-considered judgment of matters. Brighouse and Swift favor a Dworkinian approach wherein, as they put it, the conflict of values shapes the way those values are understood. Where values A, B, and C conflict we understand A as what ought to be valued given the existence of the values B and C. This of course permits overall coherence and evaluative systematicity. But as baldly stated it sounds strange and certainly needs more explication.

After all, one response to a conflict of values is just to accept that the conflict is irresoluble and acknowledge that the best feasible state of affairs is one in which there will be some moral loss. On this account it is better to have the family than not to, but any society that does have families is not going fully to realize justice (and not merely realize justice as understood given the existence of the valued family).

A final word: this book is beautifully written. It is clear, accessible and direct whilst being philosophically sophisticated and alert to the realities of our world. It redeems its promise to be readable by anyone really interested in the value of the family. That it is an extremely important book on the subject should be obvious. But it bears repeating. No philosophical discussion of the family can ignore its arguments, and all can benefit from carefully attending to these, showing where, if at all, they fail to offer a profitable approach to the problem of the family in liberal society.