Feminist Interpretations of Benedict Spinoza

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Moira Gatens (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of Benedict Spinoza, Penn State UP, 2009, 239pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780271035161.

Reviewed by Tammy Nyden, Grinnell College


Spinoza did not focus his attention on issues of sex and gender. However, his philosophical system offers many resources for current feminist discussions. This collection of essays considers Spinoza's system from this point of view, and in doing so, provides a service for both feminist and Spinoza scholarship. Feminist scholars benefit from considering the possibility of a genealogical alternative to Cartesian dualism, for instance, how Spinoza's understanding of the mind-body relationship might be used to challenge the distinction between sex and gender. Spinoza scholars not only come to better understand the contemporary relevance of Spinoza's most central tenets, but have the opportunity to reconsider the ethical and political implications of his metaphysical and epistemological doctrines, particularly his accounts of imagination and physical individuation. These tenets, for instance, have much to contribute to contemporary discussions of embodiment and related sexual and racial imaginaries.

This volume brings together five new and six previously published essays. A strength of the collection is its engagement with Spinoza's philosophy as a system and its consideration of both the Ethics and his political writings as contributing to that system. One notable exception is the article by Irigaray, which focuses solely on part I of the Ethics and misunderstands the fundamental ontology presented within it.

Moira Gatens' introduction, "Through Spinoza's 'Looking Glass'," provides the reader with a brief biography of Spinoza and a succinct overview of his Ethics, Theological-Political Treatise and Political Treatise. This overview provides a background for the following essays by pointing out that Spinoza's system, through its substance monism, avoids the dichotomies of mind and body, reason and emotion, and freedom and necessity. In doing so, his philosophy has the means to provide contemporary feminist philosophy with solutions to problems that it has seen as following from the Cartesian tradition. Further, Spinoza's mind-body theory shifts the traditional groundings of privilege by allowing the consideration of how social and political powers affect the minds and bodies of individuals.

The first essay, "Dominance and Difference: A Spinozistic Alternative to the Distinction Between 'Sex' and 'Gender'" by Genevieve Lloyd, starts off with the premise that Descartes' theory of mind leads to the bifurcation of the sex-gender distinction. Cartesian dualism, she argues, results in a sexed body distinct from a sexless mind. Further, when this is combined with his rejection of hylomorphism, the traditional higher status given to form over matter, and the role Descartes gives free will, what results is a new concept of the domination of nature through knowledge. On this account sexless minds causally interact with and through sexually differentiated bodies, resulting in a model that contemporary feminist scholars understand in terms of socially constructed gender. Lloyd argues that Spinoza offers an alternative. Since minds, on Spinoza's view, reflect the various circumstances of the bodies of which they are ideas, minds are able to reflect the similarities and differences of those bodies, whether those differences result from internal causes or socialization.

Chapter two is "Autonomy and the Relational Individual: Spinoza and Feminism" by Aurelia Armstrong. This strong essay is based on a firm understanding of Spinoza's metaphysics. Armstrong makes the point that feminist critiques converge in their rejection of theories of autonomy that contrast the "autonomous self" with the "socially unencumbered self" and therefore confuse autonomy with atomic isolation. She argues that feminism needs to come up with a way to show that social relationships and autonomy are not mutually exclusive. She argues that while these feminist concerns are foreign to Spinoza's philosophy, his understanding of the individual in terms of activity and passivity provides feminists a means to rethink the autonomous individual as exemplified in the Western liberal tradition. Spinoza's understanding of the individual in terms of the power to affect and be affected provides feminists with a means of incorporating social relationships, as well as notions of embodiment, into a refined concept of autonomy -- one which sees receptivity as a power and considers the empowerment and increasing autonomy in others as a necessary component of one's own striving for autonomy. In other words, such a revised notion would see autonomy as intrinsically social.

The third essay is "Spinoza on the Pathos of Idolatrous Love and the Hilarity of True Love" by Amelie Rorty. This article describes love from the point of view of each of Spinoza's three types of knowledge. Rorty does this by providing an engaging narrative of two lovers, Ariadne and Echo, and characterizing the nature of Ariadne's love for Echo as it develops through each of these stages. Love, for Spinoza, is elation accompanied by the idea of an external cause. What changes at each stage is how that cause is understood. At the first level, Ariadne is infatuated with Echo. Her elation consists in the passions she experiences through her various interactions with him. Because this infatuation is for a particular individual, Echo, and the passions are relational and constantly changing, love through the first level of knowledge is very difficult to maintain. However, if Ariadne reflects on the causes of the characteristics she so adores in Echo, and indeed the causes of her own passions for them, she can come to see individuals, including herself and Echo, as "complex, dynamic compounds, individuated by their history and interactions." Such reflective ideas include, in addition to their direct objects, reflections on the relations between ideas, their objects, and other ideas. As a result, her ideas become more adequate and she no longer imagines herself as affected by Echo's charms, but rather "actively indentifies herself with the system of interactive causes that have determined her." This second type of knowledge removes the intensity of Ariadne's original passive elation (her infatuation with Echo) and is replaced with an active elation that comes with understanding the true nature of individuals. But this is not where the story ends. Reason is not able to completely remove the passions (as Echo may be relieved to discover). Ariadne continues to be a particular individual with particular ideas, whether reflective or not. Now, not only does she love Echo, "but she loves Echo-as-a-particular-expression-of-the-vast-network-of-individuals that have affected him, through him she loves all that has made him." This love, through the third type of knowledge, is not 'self-sacrificing', but rather "self-expressing", for in loving Echo, she loves herself. She now attains true love, that is "the elation that comes of true knowledge, an intuitive grasp of the world, seen as a whole, immanent within one's ideas." Such elation (that affects the individual as a whole) is hilarity, which can never be excessive as it follows from an individual's own nature.

Chapter 4 is Alexandre Matheron's essay, "Spinoza and Sexuality." Matheron examines the ten passages where Spinoza directly discusses sexuality. He claims that if these passages are read carefully, a more thoughtful account of sexuality will emerge than has until this point been attributed to Spinoza. He begins by pointing out that contrary to Aquinas and Descartes, Spinoza does not distinguish between desire and love. Spinoza takes lust to be both. For Spinoza love is desire and it has no natural object. Further, there are many types of love, lust being just one of them. The object of desire in the case of lust is the sexual relation itself, not a person. This desire, like any other desire, can become obsessive, but it is not intrinsically so. In fact, Matheron says, sexuality, to the extent that it is joyful, is good in itself on Spinozistic terms. Further, there is nothing in Spinoza's understanding of the order of nature to privilege or prohibit certain forms of sexuality. He claims that Spinoza is unique in this regard.

The next chapter continues to consider how Spinoza's philosophy might contribute to discussions of sexuality. David West's essay, "Reason, Sexuality and Self in Spinoza," argues that Spinoza's philosophical system is immune to the two extremes that have plagued Western Philosophy: 1) ascetic idealism in which reason is used to overcome desires and 2) hedonism, in which reason is used to calculate how to best serve one's physical and psychological desires. These competing paradigms result from a dualism that reduces the self and sexuality to either mind and reason or body and its desires. This dualism, coupled with the teleological view that the end of sexuality is reproduction, drives a deep wedge between sex and love, "so that sex, understood as little more than genital coupling, can have nothing in common with 'true' love." West argues that by rejecting this dualism, Spinoza offers an alternative in which sexual desire and love can be "mutually reinforcing." Further, Spinoza's philosophy does not contribute to an essentialism regarding sex or sexuality. Sex, like other activities, is just an "idiosyncratic expression of an individual's striving for perfection". Within this framework, there is no implicit heterosexism. Further, men and women are not defined by their roles in sexual reproduction. In this way, Spinoza's philosophy undermines the sex/gender dichotomy as he undermines the mind/body dichotomy.

Chapter 6 is an excellent essay by Heidi Morrison Ravven entitled, "What Spinoza Can Teach Us About Embodying and Naturalizing Ethics." Ravven contends that behind the standard modern Western ethical account is the Augustianian doctrine of free will. Spinoza's philosophy provides a much deeper critique of this tradition than feminist accounts, which tend to accept notions of free will as it was transformed by Cartesian and Kantian approaches. Spinoza's naturalism provides a way to break free from the Platonism of Christianity that underlies Cartesian and Kantian philosophies. Ravven points out that the problem exists in both current analytic and continental traditions and goes unnoticed because their secularism "disguises and bolsters a miraculous view of the human person that is inherent in the voluntarist notion of free will." She notes that this miraculous view of the human person was not present in medieval Islamic and Jewish philosophy, which was more strongly influenced by Aristotelian and stoic naturalist views regarding human action. Spinoza's philosophy shares these influences and determinist position. Ravven herself rejects the doctrine of free will and warns the reader against its consequences: an emphasis on blame and triumph rather than the ability to see moral actions as necessary results of natural and social systems. Therefore, the focus is on punishment, rather than on effecting social and personal change. Little focus is placed on compassion or empathy and there is a tendency for sociopolitical imperialism. She contends that the atomic person that has become the hallmark of modern philosophy is not due to a break with the Christian theological past, as MacIntrye and Taylor have claimed. Rather, the notion of atomic individualism comes precisely from the Christian theological tradition and an insufficient understanding of how strong a hold that past still has on contemporary ethics. As a corrective, she encourages the study of alternatives that do not share this Christian Platonic heritage, including Jewish and Islamic ethical traditions, as well as the philosophy of Spinoza.

The next chapter is a brief essay by Paulo Grassi called "Adam and the Serpent: Everyman and the Imagination." Grassi interprets Spinoza's narration of the fall of Adam as an allegory for a paradigm of knowledge. The serpent is an allegorical icon of the drive to imagine, not human weakness and vice. Adam begins in the human natural state of imagination and the serpent tempts him to choose to remain in that state, seducing him with the production of images, which Adam then confuses with the production of ideas. On this account, Adam's natural state is not free and Eve is not the cause of the fall, but rather the first guide toward Adam's ultimate salvation. In presenting Adam with the recognition of himself in the other, his animal energy is reoriented. He no longer envisions himself simply in terms of external causes, but comes to contemplate his own nature, with which he sees commonalities in Eve. It is through his drive to "see" Eve for what she is in reality that he comes to understand himself as an "imaginative being" and to be able to distinguish between the difference he imagines between himself and Eve and the commonalities of their human nature which are to be understood through reason.

Chapter 8 is "The Envelope: A Reading of Spinoza's Ethics, 'Of God'" by Luce Irigaray. In this essay, Irigaray translates Spinoza's definition of God as self-caused as "that which is its own place for itself, that which turns itself inside out and thus constitutes a dwelling (for) itself," in other words, that which provides its own envelope. Because humans are not self-caused, they do not provide their own envelope. Man however, she argues, finds an envelope in woman, leaving her without her own place, her own envelope. Irigaray goes on to offer a dualist understanding of Spinoza's mind-body parallelism, taking the fact that mind and body cannot interact with each other as preventing any genuine relationship between the sexes. This chapter seems out of place in this collection because it fails to engage Spinoza's philosophy. Not only does it limit itself to one book of the Ethics, rather than consider his corpus as a whole, it fails to read those passages on their own terms.

The next chapter provides a critique and alternative to Irigaray's feminist reading of Spinoza. In "Re-reading Irigaray's Spinoza," Sarah Donovan criticizes the previous article for failing to fully engage with Spinoza's philosophy, and as a result, failing to see the common concerns of Spinoza and feminism: the rejection of dualism, the elevation of the status of the body and emotions, and the rethinking of Judeo-Christian notions of God. According to Donovan, Irigaray's reading of Spinoza goes astray in reading his attribute parallelism as a form of mind/body dualism that is detrimental to women. Donovan rightly argues that this misunderstands Spinoza's fundamental ontology, which is anti-dualistic. Further, in making this mistake, Irigaray overlooks the power of Spinoza's philosophy to undermine the very dualism she herself is looking to overcome. This is unfortunate according to Donavan because it causes Irigaray to also overlook important areas where her own philosophy overlaps with that of Spinoza: in the valuation of extension, the important role the body plays in attaining knowledge and the affinity between Spinoza's 'imagination' and 'reason' and her own 'imaginary' and 'symbolic'.

"The Politics of the Imagination," by Moira Gatens is chapter 10. Gatens considers the political implications of Spinoza's theories of body and knowledge. In particular, she is interested in how, for Spinoza, reason, desire and knowledge parallel the quality and complexity of the bodily affects, and are therefore themselves 'embodied' rather than transcendent. Gatens argues that, "Spinoza's account of the imagination can be helpful here in understanding the processes through which sexual and racial differences are made politically significant, as well as how those differences are embedded within social institutions." Spinoza's concept of the body necessarily includes not only a particular body itself, but its interrelations with all other bodies. Spinoza's philosophy thus provides a way to consider how the causes of an individual's particular incapacities can be structural or systematic in nature.

The final chapter is Susan James' essay, "Law and Sovereignty in Spinoza's Politics." James argues for the importance of reading Spinoza's philosophy, particularly his treatment of imagination -- which has taken precedence in this volume -- within its proper historical and philosophical context. For James, this means considering both his Hobbesian influences and the theological-political debates of his own time. She argues that Spinoza's treatment of the imagination, both in its criticism of prophecy and its role in sociability, is central to the undermining of his contemporaries' theological positions that law can come from God's command. James point is that while the feminist readings of Spinoza's account of imagination are interesting, Spinoza himself was rather ambivalent about the consensual image of government. While I agree with James' interpretative approach, that is, considering the context of Spinoza's texts, I disagree with the last point. In fact, an examination of Spinoza's Dutch political context, and his influence by Hobbes filtered through Dutch political pamphlet writers such as Lambertus van Velthuysen and Pieter de la Court, indicate a great concern with consensual government.