Feminist Interpretations of Thomas Hobbes

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Nancy J. Hirschmann and Joanne H. Wright (eds.), Feminist Interpretations of Thomas Hobbes, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2012, 312pp., $32.95 (hbk). ISBN 9780271056364.

Reviewed by Sylvana Tomaselli, St John's College, Cambridge


This volume is the latest addition to an impressive list of 'feminist re-interpretations of the writings of major figures in the Western philosophical tradition' under the general editorship of Nancy Tuana, whose collection, Feminist Interpretations of Plato (1994), launched the series. Authors covered thus far include Machiavelli, Hume, Sartre and Adorno as well as Simone de Beauvoir, Ayn Rand, Mary Daly, and Emma Goldman. Each collections brings together some original and some previously published essays in an attempt to cover the entirety of a given philosopher's thought through an array of feminist perspectives.

As Nancy J. Hirschmann and Joanne H. Wright, the editors of the present volume remark, Hobbes has been an author of interest to feminists for some time, most notably, through the work of Teresa Brennan and Carole Pateman. In fact, one of the book's four sections is dedicated to showing how Hobbes' impact on feminist writers long predates twentieth-century preoccupations with his account of the state of nature, the social contract, and sovereignty. The three chapters of Part Three, 'Hobbes and His(torical) Women', consider the political and philosophical thought of Margaret Cavendish, Mary Astell and Catharine Macaulay, and bring these writers into the discussion either by way of contrast to Hobbes or as his critics. They reveal the extent and complexity of the influence Hobbes exercised on feminist philosophers from the early modern period onwards. Then as now engagement with Hobbes was inspiring. Karen Detlefsen shows how Cavendish 'offers a refreshing alternative to Hobbes's theory of freedom', while Karen Green sees Astell and Macaulay as forerunners of contemporary feminist critiques of Hobbesian contract theory, and Wendy Gunther-Canada demonstrates that 'feminist readers can learn much from Catharine Macaulay's Loose Remarks about Thomas Hobbes's attempts to decouple paternal authority from patriarchy in De Cive' (211).

This said, Hirschmann and Wright believe that Hobbes remains relatively 'undertreated', something their compilation is intended to rectify, but not at the cost of distorting him. 'There is no "straw Hobbes" here', we are assured in their introduction, 'no caricatured picture of Hobbes as theorizing the "atomistic individualism", "possessive individualism", or "abstract individualism" of which feminists were enamored in the 1970s and 1980s; there is no reductionist Hobbesian man incapable of relationship, peace, or love'. What we are promised is a 'nuanced and complex' Hobbes, and it is fair to say that no old scarecrow Hobbes is to be seen in the essays newly written for this volume, or in those of Gordon Schochet, whose 'Thomas Hobbes on the Family and the State of Nature' was first published in 1967, or Gunther-Canada's, whose 'Catharine Macaulay's "Loose Remarks" on Hobbesian Politics' is a revised version of an article published in 2006.

Most engagingly the volume opens with an interview Hirschmann and Wright conducted with Pateman and Quentin Skinner. Through it, we are reminded of each conversationalist's work on Hobbes, their attraction to him and their respective approaches to him. The tone is almost confessional to begin with, and the exchange that follows is real, the disagreements clear, and the whole informative about Pateman's Hobbes no less than Skinner's, and arguably also Hobbes himself. It could easily become compulsory reading for those studying him as well as those interested in either of these two interlocutors' very different ways of engaging with canonical figures.

Much is made of the egalitarian Hobbes in the essays that follow. Indeed, that logical moment of equality between men and women and the problematic it engenders is what seems to capture the imagination of the writers. In the Hobbesian beginning, men and women were roughly equal. Hobbes' position was and remained unusual. Eighteenth-century writers, who in the footsteps of natural law theorists thought about the state of nature, believed the very opposite: the state of nature was one in which men exploited their physical superiority to the outmost. The state of nature in their accounts was one of rape and acquisition. The issue for them was to explain what had made for the gradual improvement of the condition of women from their initial enslavement to one of relative enfranchisement. They sought to trace the progress of their emancipation, often with a view to hastening its final stages. They were asking an essentially historical question, albeit a conjectural one. Hobbes, on the other hand, would have had to set himself opposite riddles, namely, how did women lose their pre-historic or natural equality and hence freedom, and was it inevitable? The fact is he did not. Unlike Jean-Jacques Rousseau, who like so many other political thinkers was much indebted to him, Hobbes did not address the question of the origins of inequality; one could argue that he did not seek to answer questions so much as to set people right about the conditions for peace and what this required, not least of which was an understanding on their part of the true nature of freedom.

That he did not press that question has left the way open for feminists to do so. The opening chapter of Part I, 'Classic Questions, New Approaches', S. A. Loyd's 'Power and Sexual Subordination in Hobbes's Political Theory', starts with Hobbes's presumption of equality, and goes on to argue most effectively that there is nothing in his formal theory that assumes or entails the subordination of women. Likewise Jane S. Jaquette, in her 'Defending Liberal Feminism: Insights from Hobbes', challenges early feminist interpretations of Hobbes' such as those of Jean Elshtain, Pateman, and Kathleen Jones, and contends rightly that there is much to be gained by feminists from an accurate reading of Leviathan. It is the latter's image of the body of the common-wealth and the mechanical clock of De Cive that captivate Su Fang Ng in her 'Hobbes and the Bestial Body of Sovereignty' and, arrestingly, lead her to consider the importance of the wolf in Hobbes' conception of the nature of sovereignty: 'If in the state of nature homo homini lupus est -- man is wolf to man -- then at the most fundamental level the gender of the parent does not matter to Hobbes even if the mother has sovereignty in the state of nature.' What matters, she continues, 'is whether the child encounters the wolf who suckles or the one who devours'. (97) Fang Ng's essay thus concludes the first Part of the collection as imaginatively as it had began. But there is more to come.

Re-printing Gordon Schochet's seminal 'Thomas Hobbes on the Family and the State of Nature' was a good editorial decision. Hirschmann's 'Gordon Schochet on Hobbes, Gratitude, and Women' shows how stimulating it remains as she contends that while he undermined the view that liberalism bifurcated public and private ('radical and powerful stuff for feminist theorizing to make use of'), Schochet 'gives us feminism without women' (126). She tackles the question that Schochet avoided, and which Hobbes had ignored: 'How is it that free and equal natural women are subordinated in the patriarchal family?'. She proposes a number of answers, given not only Schochet's, but also Pateman's, reading of Hobbes. None proves, in her view (and rightly so), satisfactory as none is fully consistent with their respective interpretations, or indeed Hobbes' own pronouncements about mothers in the state of nature, families in civil societies, and obedience more generally. One hypothetical answer explored by Hirschmann to the question as to why it is that women as a whole came to be, and crucially remain, subjected to men as a whole, is that they were and are grateful for the peace and security they thereby enjoy. While she makes it very much worth entertaining, it may well be that her ultimate dissatisfaction with this explanation is due to a number of related factors.

Hobbes speaks of gratitude most notably in two instances in Leviathan. Of these the second is seemingly the most significant. It is to be found in Chapter 15, where he lists it as the fourth law of nature: 'As Justice dependeth on Antecedent Covenant; so does GRATITUDE depend on Antecedent Grace; which may be conceived in this Forme, That a man which receiveth Benefit from another of meer Grace, Endeavour that he which giveth, have no reasonable cause to repent of him of his good will' (Richard Tuck, ed., Cambridge University Press 2002, 105). The Law of Nature commands us to be grateful to those who present us with a gift. Whether the fact that men do not kill women or provide them with protection from other men can be construed as a gift, or was what Hobbes had in mind when he spoke of 'Antecedent Free-gift' is a contentious, but without a doubt, interesting subject. Equally or possibly even more so is the first mention of gratitude in Chapter XI 'Of the difference of Manners':

But to have received benefits from one, whom we acknowledge superiour, enclines to love; because the obligation is no new depression: and cheerful acceptation, (which men call Gratitude,) is such an honour done to the obliger, as is taken generally for retribution. Also to receive benefits, though from an equall, or inferiour, as long as there is hope of requital, disposeth to love: for in the intention of the receiver, the obligation is of ayd, and service mutuall; from when proceedeth an Emulation of who shall exceed in benefitting; the most noble and profitable contention possible; wherein the victor is pleased with his victory, and the other revenged by confessing it. (Ibid., 71)

On the assumption that women perceive the protection they receive as a gift from men whom they might deem superior, equal or indeed even inferior, they will be inclined to love them, either because they are honoured by those they view as their superiors or because they hope to return the favour made to those they think of as their equals or inferiors. On this view, love is what keeps women in their place, not mere gratitude.

Love may well be a highly problematic notion in any context and an even more so as an explanation for female subjection, but it cannot be left out of a discussion which has its roots in Hobbes's account of human relationships. Hirschmann has thus given us good cause to return to the text and push open the door she has unlocked for us.

The final section of the volume, 'Hobbes in the Twenty-First Century, or What had Hobbes Done for You lately?', begins with an essay on abortion by Joanne Boucher in which she concludes that 'reading Hobbes through the prism of his preoccupation with the body and the inviolable right to individual self-defense and self-preservation leads to a pro-choice position on abortion' (235). Continuing on the topic of choice, Joanne H. Wright's chapter provides an examination of the relationship between consent and coercion in which she argues that however wide the gulf between Hobbes's politics and those of contemporary feminists might be, his 'thinking about consent can help us understand the choice feminist language that legitimizes breast augmentation, just as the problems inherent in choice feminism can, in turn, aid us in better understanding Hobbes's own thought' (255). The collection ends with sex. Unsurprisingly given the tenor of what preceded it, this final chapter finds Susanne Sreedhar contending that both the progressive nation-builder and the progressive reformer 'can draw inspiration from the rational, liberated form of sexuality Hobbes (or Hobbes reconstructed) seems to offer' (277).

If nothing else, this volume will make us want to return to Hobbes. It keeps its promise not to re-produce the caricatured Hobbes hitherto found in histories of philosophy. It reveals a feminism at ease with itself, one confidently embarked on a constructive phase. While some of the elaborations of Hobbes' views or theoretical constructions based on them will appear heretical to some exegetes, it would be difficult to deny that the essays that make up this book are insightful, imaginative and stimulating. The editors have served both Hobbes and feminism well through.