Feminist Phenomenology Futures

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Helen A. Fielding and Dorothea E. Olkowski (eds.), Feminist Phenomenology Futures, Indiana University Press, 2017, 364 pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253029942.

Reviewed by Emily Anne Parker, Towson University


Johanna Oksala has asked, "How can phenomenology as a philosophical method of investigation account for gender?"[1] With their recent book, Helen A. Fielding and Dorothea E. Olkowski bring together essays that seek to answer this question. Together with Emily S. Lee's Living Alterities: Phenomenology, Embodiment, and Race,[2] Fielding and Olkowsi's volume demonstrates the changing meaning of phenomenology in the present.

The book begins with two introductory pieces, a ground-breaking "A Feminist Phenomenology Manifesto" by Helen A. Fielding and a detailed introduction to the volume by both editors. Fielding presents feminist phenomenology as a method made possible by material multiplicity. Phenomenology properly understood is an engagement on the part of a material multiplicity in the study of its collective self. Perception, a multiply located embodied event, is the occasion for consciousness as well as knowledge and politics. Such materiality in its multiplicity thus serves as the focus of a feminist phenomenology, a phenomenology that can turn its method on sites of relevance for feminist projects that are not confined to the study of gender alone. Phenomenology for Fielding and Olkowski, as well as seemingly all contributors to the volume, cannot at all distinguish materiality from consciousness or bracket bodily experiences. While many have rightly worried about the supposed universality presumed in classical phenomenological explorations of subjectivity, others whom this volume seeks to feature have sought to repurpose certain phenomenological methods that explore an embodied, living lifeworld that is characterized by asymmetries and folds of power.

This approach, Fielding suggests in the "Manifesto," necessarily displaces much of the history of the phenomenological project insofar as it has denied or neglected perception and sensation. This displacement reveals that same history to be insufficiently phenomenological insofar as it was insufficiently curious about the materiality responsible for phenomenology itself. Previous phenomenologies cut off exploration of materiality and its corollary, multiplicity, and in doing so denied lived experiences supposedly incompatible with the project of articulating universal structures of consciousness. On this point, it might have been helpful to include accounts of tensions within the tradition of phenomenology regarding the status of universality. But the aim of the present volume is the future. This work springs largely from the possibilities opened up by Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Hannah Arendt, Maria Lugones, Simone de Beauvoir and others, offering helpful indications of a future phenomenology that begins from material multiplicity instead of denying or transcending it. This future is now, as Olkowski and Fielding put it in volume's introduction.

The book has five sections. The first, "The Future is Now," includes essays that seek to model the notion of feminist phenomenology set out in Fielding's manifesto. The second section, "Negotiating Futures," features essays focusing on the uncertainty necessary to the political understood as a heterogeneous and concrete project. The third section, "The Ontological Future," provides three quite distinct approaches to a phenomenological ontology that is nevertheless in each case process-oriented. The fourth, "Our Future Body Images," foregrounds recent work that can be read as extending Gail Weiss's phenomenology of body images and includes a new essay by Weiss herself.[3] The fifth and final section, "Present and Future Selves," is particularly helpful for thinking through the very notion of human being as material multiplicity. This section includes an important essay by Emily S. Lee, "Identity-in-Difference to Avoid Indifference," on the political dangers of insisting too strongly on multiplicity. This essay contributes to the complexity of the book as a whole.

The fifth section, and so the book, ends with an essay by Silvia Stoller entitled "What is Feminist Phenomenology? Looking Backward and Into the Future." This chapter nicely completes the bookended structure of the volume, beginning and ending with the very question of what feminist phenomenology is. Indeed, this is a central question that the book both poses and rightly struggles to answer. In this final essay, Stoller offers a genealogical account. I found it rewarding to cheat and flip to the back to read this essay before I had read most of the book.

In this final chapter Stoller admits, echoing Johanna Oksala's question of how phenomenology can even begin to account for gender, that it is not so easy to define what feminist phenomenology is. Scholars speak of both "feminist phenomenology" and "phenomenological feminism": "feminist phenomenology is a feminist-oriented phenomenology, whereas phenomenological feminism can be characterized as a phenomenologically oriented feminism."[4] This terrain is the result of roughly two phases. In the first, beginning with the work of Simone de Beauvoir, there was strictly speaking no such thing as feminist phenomenology. In this period there is also the work of philosophers Edith Stein, Gerda Walther, and Hannah Arendt. Like Beauvoir, none of these describe the work they are doing as phenomenological, and yet Stein and Walther were both students of and influenced by the work of Edmund Husserl. Hannah Arendt, whose work is unquestionably composed of existential and phenomenological themes, in particular has served as a source for much recent work in feminist phenomenology. In this volume, the work of Helen A. Fielding, Katy Fulfer and Rita Gardiner are examples. At any rate, none of these four -- Beauvoir, Stein, Walther, Arendt -- designated their work phenomenological, and yet all are considered the early phase of feminist phenomenology. In other more recent writing influenced by Beauvoir, for example that of Judith Butler and Carol Bigwood, the trend continues: Phenomenology is unmistakably present in the attempt to sort out what "gender" means, but the writers do not identify the work being done as feminist phenomenology.

It is not until the mid-1990s that a second phase appears, that of the institutionalization of academic work explicitly named feminist phenomenology. The start of this period can be seen in the work of Iris Marion Young as well as in two edited volumes, Silvia Stoller and Helmuth Vetter's Phänomenologie und Geschlechterdifferenz and Linda Fisher and Lester Embree's Feminist Phenomenology.[5] The present volume is the most recent edited collection in this second phase of a burgeoning feminist phenomenological tradition.

In 2006, Johanna Oksala first argued that it is not yet clear how phenomenology can study gender at all, such that this method could become "feminist."[6] Oksala argues that there are at least three ways of understanding phenomenological method: a classical reading, a corporeal reading, and an intersubjective reading. The classical reading of phenomenology regards it as the study of a universal subjectivity. A corporeal reading of phenomenology understands it as the study of a lived body that is not distinguishable from consciousness. A third, intersubjective reading takes phenomenology to be the study of locally shared and normative elements of consciousness such as language and history. The present volume combines, to very interesting effect, the second and third of these modes of phenomenology.

For Oksala, all three -- the classical, the corporeal, and the intersubjective -- have a problematic relationship to the study of gender; it's not clear how they can allow for a phenomenology of gender at all. In effect, the first two render "feminist phenomenology" an oxymoron. The classical reading cannot account for gender insofar as bodily characteristics of the transcendental ego are bracketed. Corporeality is not excluded from transcendental subjectivity, but phenomenology as a transcendental method must rise above this material level in order to explore transcendental subjectivity. Oksala argues that if it were not possible to rise above the body, that would mean that there are two distinct transcendental subjectivities. Thus, a phenomenology of this sort is either un-feminist in that it is incapable of getting traction with feminist concerns at all, or it is un-feminist in presupposing that transcendental subjectivity is itself dimorphically sexed. It presupposes a pair of subjectivities instead of explaining them. The corporeal reading holds more promise, but Oksala worries that it threatens to undo feminist work on the unnaturalness of specific gendering practices. Corporeal readings tend to project a generalized femaleness or femininity that results from an in fact polarized set of biological bodies. In other words, this mode of phenomenology presupposes a dimorphism of embodiment. While Oksala seems entirely sympathetic with curiosity about the bodily features of gender, to the point that she at least rhetorically equates gender with sexual difference, she rejects any eidetic account of feminine embodiment. She is interested in the lived experiences of gendering -- not the apolitical biological facts but the power-laden lived experiences. For Oksala, this must include the work of intersex and trans people of at least a variety of relationships to these concepts. Thus, a feminist phenomenology in the corporeal reading is likewise oxymoronic. To explore one's body without interrogation of broader historical practices of power leaves such an account to ponder itself in the first-person as if gender is either a pure biological fact or otherwise apolitical event.

To move beyond a pure corporeal account in Oksala's sense, one might look to what she calls an intersubjective reading. An intersubjective reading is one that builds on Husserl's own interest in the importance of the homeworld of the transcendental subject. Here, finally, is a place where gender could be studied, not as a self-evident fact about a body, but as the place where meanings that can be called "gender" take shape. This third reading of phenomenology can offer an account of gender: it is an intersubjectively created system of normalization. But Oksala argues that this way of thinking about phenomenology is in fact at odds with other key elements of phenomenological method, namely the radical first-person as well as the transcendental reduction. The transcendental reduction she argues is justified only on the basis of the shared nature of consciousness that is the first-person writ large. Thus, even in this most hopeful moment of phenomenology, we encounter a problem of circularity. The radical first-person should give way to an exploration of the transcendental features of a shared cultural world, but this shared cultural world is a function of the first-person. We might interject here that if someone whose first-person experience challenged the normalized universality of a culture were to practice phenomenology, that would matter. But Oksala's worry is that this is more or less the corporeal reading of phenomenology. That is the very method that has yielded a suspicious pre-political eidetic femaleness or femininity, as discussed above.

The three readings of phenomenology -- classical, corporeal, intersubjective -- offered by Oksala are meant to raise the question of how phenomenology might be made into a feminist pursuit, even though it was not understood in this way originally. Oksala ultimately argues for a post-phenomenology. Interestingly several contributors to the present volume appear to be engaging in a revision of phenomenology that arguably comes very close to what Oksala means by this. Christina Shües argues for a "bio-phenomenology." Annemie Halsema and Jenny Slatman work out a phenomenology in the second-person that serves to explore narrative in biomedicine. From the very start of the book, Fielding worries about any phenomenology taken to be a method for locating a gender-free transcendental subjectivity. And so, on the whole, the book suspends the boundaries of phenomenology.

It also insists on combining what Oksala names the second and third reading of phenomenology. According to Fielding and Olkowski, it is precisely in response to the classical project that the corporeal one emerges in the work of Merleau-Ponty. He rejects the classical phenomenological project insofar as he holds that a totalizing reduction of transcendental consciousness is neither possible nor desirable. While Fielding and Olkowski and a number of other contributors to the volume would seem to ascribe in part to this corporeal reading, what I find very interesting is that in every case the intersubjective reading is indistinguishable from it. The essays include a number of explorations of bodily events, inspired by Merleau-Ponty's own interest in the varieties of sensation, explorations that could be understood as examples of the corporeal reading: menstruation in an essay by Kyoo Lee, pregnancy in an essay by Katy Fulfer, breast amputation and breast saving in the essay by Annemie Halsema and Jenny Slatman. Phenomenology in these essays seeks to understand not the lived body, but the plurality of lived bodies. This plurality is approached in every case through what Oksala calls the intersubjective reading, suggesting that for many self-identified feminist phenomenologists these are not two distinct readings of phenomenology at all. I now want to discuss briefly two essays that illustrate this method of combining the corporeal and the intersubjective readings. I finish with a question raised by Oksala and with which the present volume leaves me: Does the phenomenological method need to be modified for it to be able to problematize and provincialize certain modes of intersubjectivity?

Kyoo Lee's "Just Throw Like a Bleeding Philosopher: Menstrual Pauses and Poses, Betwixt Hypatia and Bhubaneswari, Half Visible, Almost Illegible" is an example of the combined corporeal and intersubjective readings of phenomenology. Lee's interest is in menstruation and takes this to be inseparable from its abjection. Is this feminist phenomenology? There is a worry that, as my discussion of Oksala suggests, such a phenomenology, insofar as it is in the corporeal mode alone, reifies menstruation as well as lived experiences of it. And it is the case that Lee explicitly sets aside at the start of the essay the fact that it's not only women who menstruate and not all women menstruate. This seems a really significant aspect of menstruation, one that cannot be set aside: menstruation is presumed to be definitive of a dimorphic cisgender that must keep itself quiet. But at any rate, for Lee the lived experience of menstruation is the lived experience of its neglect: "Is philosophy still in its puberty with respect to its own menstrual (non-)thought?"[7] This essay demonstrates a sense of phenomenology as requiring both the exploration of such a non-universal bodily event and the lifeworld that has a (neglected) place for it. Quite apart from the question of a feminist phenomenology, such a project suggests quite a radical revision of phenomenology itself insofar as an explicitly un-shareable body is now its delightful yet problematic departure. It would seem to be the very self-interrogating material multiplicity that Helen Fielding's "Manifesto" argues makes phenomenology possible.

Dolleen Tisawii'ashii Manning's "The Murmuration of Birds: An Anishinaabe Ontology of Mnidoo-Worlding" offers a second example of this method of combining corporeal and intersubjective readings of phenomenology. If Lee's essay would seem (mistakenly) at first glance to be an example of the corporeal reading alone, Manning's would seem (again mistakenly) at first to offer an intersubjective one alone. But here again the two readings are intertwined. And again, this essay offers a phenomenological method in keeping with Fielding's interest in the "Manifesto" in phenomenology as a method of self-study of material multiplicities. Manning presents a "phenomenological translation" of mnidoo, which is an ontology of reciprocal belonging and animacy of the Ojibwe Anishanaabe.[8] Manning's essay is the result of an effort to reflect on the intersubjective, a world that she acknowledges is at some remove from the one into which mnidoo must be translated. But it is also an essay in the corporeal mode insofar as she's interested in the relations among "bodies," which are not distinct in mnidoo-worlding. The essay knits Merleau-Pontian flesh together with Manning's own sensations of mnidoo. Such sensations are only possible because of a broader flesh that subtends it. An isolated corporeal self-study is not possible, but neither is a disembodied intersubjective one.

Does phenomenological method need to be modified in order for it to be possible to get some distance from and render strange certain modes of intersubjectivity? This would seem to be necessary for a feminist phenomenology that could rightly call itself "feminist." Oksala argues that such a modification is necessary: "to start the analysis from a woman's experience when trying to understand what a woman is means already assuming that which we seek to explain."[9] How can phenomenologists exit their own corporeal-intersubjective world, her own ontological structures, his own lifeworld, in order to create feminist phenomenology, decolonial phenomenology? For Oksala, the answer is combining phenomenology with projects better described as anthropology, ethnology, history, and psychopathology. In the terms of the present volume, I suspect that these fields could be phenomenology in altered form, understood now as a multiplicitous endeavor: "We want to argue instead for a feminist phenomenological approach that begins with multiple, meaningful points of view on relational being."[10]

[1] Johanna Oksala, Feminist Experiences: Foucauldian and Phenomenological Investigations (Northwestern University Press, 2016), 97.

[2] Emily S. Lee, Living Alterities: Phenomenology, Embodiment, and Race (State University of New York Press, 2014). Lee is also a contributor to the present volume.

[3] Gail Weiss, Body Images: Embodiment as Intercorporeality (Routledge, 1999).

[4] Helen S. Fielding and Dorothea E. Olkowski, Feminist Phenomenology Futures (Indiana University Press, 2017), 328.

[5] Stoller and Helmuth Vetter, eds. Phänomenologie und Geschlechterdifferenz (Vienna: WUV-Universitätsverlag, 1996); Linda Fisher and Lester Embree, Feminist Phenomenology (Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2000).

[6] Johanna Oksala. "A Phenomenology of Gender," Continental Philosophy Review 39 no. 3 (2006). This essay appears in revised form as Chapter 6 of Oksala's Feminist Experiences.

[7] Fielding and Olkowski, 25.

[8] Ibid., 155, 174. Manning's footnote 6 is crucial. There she explains the specificity of the "small portion of knowledge that I have been given" of this intersubjectivity (176), which makes her "responsible to give back" not in service of a recovery but ontological elaboration for the future (174).

[9] Oksala, Feminist Experiences, 104.

[10] Fielding and Olkowski, xvi.