Fichte's Social and Political Philosophy: Property and Virtue

Placeholder book cover

David James, Fichte's Social and Political Philosophy: Property and Virtue, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 222 pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107001558.

Reviewed by Manfred Kuehn, Boston University


Fichte attempted to demonstrate in his Foundations of Natural Right (Grundlage des Naturrechts, nach den Principien der Wissenschaftslehre) that the concept of right, as well the laws and the state are necessary conditions for the possibility of self-consciousness. It was to be an essential and foundational part of hisWissenschaftslehre. His discussion of natural right was therefore ab initio a much more ambitious enterprise than most accounts of natural law. It does not start from positive law or even from morality, but from the self-positing (Selbtsetzung) of free yet finite beings. In other words, it is an attempt at an a priori foundation of natural law. It is therefore hardly surprising that some, like Joachim Ritter, for instance, have argued that Fichte therefore "deduces and postulates a priori state and legal systems out of his own head as 'absolute Ego'" (p. 4).

This book is intended to provide an argument against this negative interpretation of Fichte's project. James claims that Fichte did not just deduce and postulate a priori, but also took into account "the empirical relations between human beings" (p. 5). More specifically, he claims that Fichte's theory depends on understanding the potential for conflict between human beings. This understanding is supposed to show itself primarily in Fichte's theory of property. A second concern has to do with the concepts of recognition and virtue. Though the concept of virtue does "not appear to play an especially important role in Fichte's ethical writings”, James argues that his political philosophy presupposes "a social or political form of virtue" (p. 17).

Accordingly, the book concentrates on the two themes of property and virtue, as well as on their relation to the concept of freedom that is most central to Fichte's political philosophy. In other words, James does not intend to offer a comprehensive account of Fichte's social and political philosophy. He restricts himself even further, in claiming to deal only with Fichte's works that appeared between 1794 and 1808. In other words, James claims not to discuss Fichte's pamphlets on the French Revolution of 1793 and the political works of the last four years of his life. One can understand the first restriction; the second is more difficult to comprehend, not just because relatively little happened to Fichte's political philosophy between 1809 and 1813, but also because his revolutionary writings of 1793 would seem to be of great importance for understanding Fichte's views on property and human conflict. The claim is even more difficult to understand, as James actually offers a fairly extensive discussion of the most important of Fichte's pamphlets (see pp. 59-69).

The book consists of an Introduction, five chapters and a relatively short bibliography (pp. 208-211). The first chapter concerns Fichte's theory of property (pp. 21-55). The second one is entitled "Applying the concept of right: Fichte and Babeuf" (pp. 56-86), the third "Fichte's reappraisal of Kant's theory of cosmopolitan right" (pp. 87-111), the fourth "The relation of right to morality in Fichte's Jena theory of the state and society" (pp. 112-161) and the fifth "The role of virtue in theAddresses to the German Nation" (pp. 162-207). All these chapters include "some revised material" that appeared previously (p. xi). The titles of the five chapters correspond exactly to the titles of the previously published papers.

In what follows, I will ignore the third chapter, as it contributes little to James' overall project. It may well be true that James shows that Fichte was "aware of the dangers of an overly formalistic approach." The chapter may also be interesting for the discussion of the Kant-Fichte relation, but it shows little about the stated central problem, namely the question whether Fichte merely deduces and postulates laws and states a priori from an absolute Ego.

In the first chapter, James argues that, in spite of all the similarities Fichte's concept of property has to that of John Locke, he managed to develop an original theory. James' real concern seems to be, however, to provide an argument against Frederick Neuhouser's claim that "even though Fichte's theory remains squarely within the liberal tradition, it at the same time provides a framework for defending many of the ideas espoused by socialist thinkers in the following century" (p. 22, see also pp. 8f.). He essentially argues that Neuhouser's assertion is an exaggeration. Fichte's views do not correspond closely to the liberal conception of property rights. Among other things, it fails to recognize the extent to which Fichte actually "limits the right to private property in favour of economic rights" (p. 23). Land cannot be privately owned, for instance, and the government may find it necessary to redistribute other resources, like tools. Even the freedom to dispose of property as we please is limited for Fichte (pp. 40ff.). Indeed, Fichte viewed himself "as restricting freedom of choice in order to safeguard the freedom of all citizens in the state . . . to use and develop their capacities by means of their own self-activity" (p. 44). He should therefore be considered as one of the most important philosophers of property rights and distributive justice, but also as a philosopher who advocated a kind of political order that is "very different in kind from a liberal one in any meaningful sense of the term" (pp. 7, 55).

The second chapter is intended to strengthen our doubts about the liberal interpretation of Fichte's political philosophy by pointing out "a strong link" between Fichte's political philosophy and "the radical phase of the French Revolution, as exemplified by some of the main ideas . . . of Gracchus Babeuf" (p. 55). James relies in this argument only on certain analogies between Fichte and Babeuf, not on any proof that Fichte actually read him. He mainly follows Weber and Leon (pp. 69, 56f.). Essentially he seems to want to establish that Fichte's theory is socialist or pre-Marxist, rather than liberal. I believe that he has a strong case, even though it does not appear to me necessary to invoke Babeuf to support this thesis. The argument would be just as strong, if they were based on Fichte's texts alone. Still, one might say the discussion presents an analogy that is interesting in its own right.

The fourth chapter discusses the interesting and distinctive Fichtean claim that law (Recht) is independent of morality or ethics. James argues that Fichte believed right and morality are "essentially separable from each other," but are nevertheless also related -- especially "when it comes to the question of the possibility of a state that functions in a truly effective manner and has the potential to flourish" (p. 114). This is where the virtues come in. "Fichte appears to rely heavily on the possession and exercise of virtue by at least some people within the state" (p. 147). State officials, for instance, need to be virtuous, and the scholar's moral vocation is of utmost importance. James' argument is interesting and points in the right direction, or so it seems to me. I am, however, very doubtful about his attempt to implicate the virtues so heavily in this process. It appears to me that Fichte's conception of the moral law and its demands on individuals might have done just as well, if not better. It demands of every member of the state, but especially the "higher" classes, that they overcome their individual desires and strive to serve thegeneral aims of humanity, for whose attainment the state plays an all-important role. Fichte argues in the contexts James mentions (and in his ethical works) for a kind of collectivism or socialism, in which every person tries to contribute to the moral perfection of every other person.

This becomes clear not just in Fichte's Addresses to the German Nation, but also in his Vocation of the Scholar, both of which James discusses in his last chapter. Fichte's distasteful nationalism and his rather outlandish views on history get rather more extensive play in James' account than they deserve (pp. 168-187). I agree with him that we "can regard Fichte's own use of history, in which historical fact serves merely as a means to an end which Fichte considers a higher one, as providing an example of how a scholar might avail himself of [his] alleged right with all its hidden dangers" (p. 186). But this does not help in any way whatsoever with the thesis that virtue forms a central part of Fichte's political philosophy.

It is also true that Fichte suggests German national education should aim to "produce moral subjects for whom a darkening of the consciousness of duty would not be possible," but in order fully to understand this suggestion, a more extensive discussion of Fichte's system of ethics would have been necessary. What our moral vocation or sittliche Bestimmung is and how it figures into politics is best discussed by Fichte in those contexts, yet they play a strangely subordinate role in this book. The System of Ethics (Das System der Sittenlehre nach den Prinzipien der Sittenlehre) of 1798 actually plays less of a role in this book than The Closed Commercial State (Der geschlossene Handelsstaat) of 1800.

Fichte argues in Ethics against the virtues and for a theory that is in some respects more radically "Kantian" than Kant himself. He claims among other things that we have a duty to promote the morality of others -- at least indirectly. We have "the absolute and universal duty to spread and to promote morality outside of ourselves," and since we cannot force morality on anyone, the "first step of moral cultivation is the development of respect."[1] We should do this by setting a good example and making our maxims "public." This "publication" of our maxims is, of course, also a political act. Indeed, it is perhaps the most central political act for an individual, according to Fichte. Furthermore, he argues that our ruling maxim should always be to do our duty simply because it is our duty.

It is this disposition and not virtue, I would argue, that is presupposed by Fichte's political philosophy. Thus he claims in the very context in which he exalts the publicity of maxims that it would be "shameful" to describe such acts as "special friendship," "partiality," "generosity," "grace," and the like, and these "shameful" descriptions of supposedly moral acts sound very much like some of the social virtues defended by someone like Hume, for instance. So virtue is at the very least a questionable category for Fichte. Furthermore, it seems to me for the same reasons that it would have been better if James had concentrated more on the concept of respect than he does.

Nor do I think that Fichte's moral views are completely unproblematic for his political convictions. Since he also claimed that the categorical imperative should be rendered as "act purely and simply in accordance with your conviction concerning your duty" and claimed that this conviction had to be absolutely correct, if it is held firmly enough and fits in with all of our other convictions, it can easily lead to such misguided views as Fichte's German nationalism.[2] I would have liked to have heard more about this question and why it is a desirable or undesirable principle and whether it is compatible with the freedom of all citizens in the state and the development of their capacities by means of their own self-activity.

However, the main problem I have with the book is that it simply claims views like Ritter's must be wrong because Fichte also talks about the "application" of his principles. "Application" clearly is not sufficient to refute the charge that the principles have been freely invented a priori, simply because arbitrary principles can also be applied effectively. More would be needed to answer Ritter's charge. Nor is it that this could not be supplied from Fichte's texts, but in order to do so, it would be necessary to delve more deeply into Fichte's methodological considerations than is possible here. Let it suffice to say that while Fichte thought we should not base our principles on empirical facts, he never thought they should be ignored either, since the Wissenschaftslehre should re-construct the very principles that are necessary to make these facts possible.[3] The task of a book like this should therefore be to see whether the principles deduced by Fichte really do make possible the political experience we have. Again, there are beginnings or materials for such an argument in the book. It’s unfortunate that they were not made explicit.

Accordingly, while I believe that much in this book is correct, that it goes some way in showing that Ritter's dismissal of the Rechtslehre is too quick, that Fichte is closer to socialism than to liberalism, and that the notion of property and its ethical implications are much more important than has so far been realized, I do not think that the book successfully establishes and defends the central claim that virtue is presupposed in Fichte's political philosophy.

[1] Johann Gottlieb Fichte, The System of Ethics. Tr. Daniel Brezeale and Günter Zöller (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005), p. 298.

[2] Fichte, The System of Ethics, p. 155. His absolute criterion for the correctness of our conviction concerning duty is for him "a feeling of truth and certainty" that cannot be altered by the individual that acts on it. "Such a conviction transposes the person in question into a state of harmony with the original I," elevates him above all time and change and is the source of the imperturbability of firm conviction.

[3] It's an entirely different matter to ask whether this method is ultimately sound, however.