Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right: A Critical Guide

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Gabriel Gottlieb (ed.), Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 272pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107078147.

Reviewed by George di Giovanni, McGill University


This collection of twelve uniformly instructive essays is intended as a guide to Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right (1796). It is a welcome contribution to the current burgeoning Fichte scholarship. Two issues run across the collection. One is the relation of Fichte's concept of right to the moral law as defined by Kant's categorical imperative. The other is Fichte's attempted derivation of the concept from the absolute I, in the course of which he introduces the further concept of "summon" to define the specifically legal relation of individual to individual in society. This "summon" is perhaps the most characteristic feature of Fichte's theory of right. In one way or another, all the contributors have to come to terms with it. But, precisely because they do so from different points of view, and with contrasting interests, together they succeed in presenting a duly nuanced picture of Fichte's theory of right.

As is well known, but James A. Clarke details for us, Fichte altered his position in 1796. In two earlier writings of 1793/94, he had held, following such Kant-inspired legal theorists as Gottlieb Hufeland and Theodor Schmalz, that natural rights are dependent on the moral law (in effect, on Kant's categorical imperative). The science of right, therefore, is derivable from the science of morality. In 1796, however, Fichte advanced the directly contrary thesis that right is independent of moral theory. The motivation behind the change must have been the recognition that, although the moral law might indeed cover in one way or another every human action, the force of a right nonetheless does not depend on any appeal to the moral law. For one thing, what one might be rightfully entitled to (such as enforcing the repayment of a debt), might well be morally disallowed (if it results in reducing someone to penury). Moreover, and even more to the point, claiming a right entails, on the one hand, the choice of not claiming it; on the other hand, the possibility that someone other than the one making the claim might oppose it, or in some other way interfere with it. Whereas the moral law obliges uniformly and universally, the rule of right is only permissive.

Accordingly, in 1796 Fichte deduces the concept of right independently of the moral law, basing the deduction, first, on the analytical claim that the concept denotes a specific kind of intersubjective relationship; and, second, on the transcendental argument that the concept, as so defined, is a necessary condition of self-consciousness. The subject must posit itself as an "individual" or a "person." But to posit oneself as such is to ascribe to oneself an exclusive sphere of freedom -- that is, a sphere from which other subjects are excluded. This is a freedom which necessarily also entails the freedom and inviolability of one's body. "Summon" -- a figure which Paul Franks in his contribution rightly calls "brilliant" -- defines precisely this relationship. A summon is a way of actively engaging an "other" by nonetheless making oneself passively receptive to its influence; leaving open the possibility, moreover, both for oneself and the "other," of not entering into the engagement, or of withdrawing from it once entered into. The summon sets up a norm-ruled relationship.

Fichte's derivation of right has historically not been immune to criticism, and some contributors do indeed defend it against long-standing Hegel-inspired objections of internal inconsistency. But there is no shortage of criticism within the collection itself. Frederick Neuhouser, Wayne Martin, and especially David James, while stressing the conceptual strength of Fichte's theory (in Wayne's case, specifically for providing a basis for ownership), also do not hesitate to point to its limitations.

There are two closely related issues which one would nonetheless wish were addressed more forcefully. One is whether Fichte's deduction of right is transcendental in any recognizable sense of the term, and, if it is, whether it works. The issue, though at least implicitly present elsewhere in the collection, is most conveniently addressed through Angelica Nuzzo's opening contribution. It is well known that, despite the contrary impression which Kant's moral theory might have conveyed, Kant himself did not derive the concept of right from the categorical imperative -- nor, for that matter, could he have done so consistently. Obligation of right and moral obligation are asymmetrical both in intention and extension.

Kant made this explicit only in 1797, with the publication of his Metaphysics of Morals. On the fundamental issue of the independence of right from moral law, Kant and the 1796 Fichte are at one. Nonetheless, it is still significant to note whatever difference there still might be in the way they each introduce the concept in their systems, and the difference that this might make for the systems. This is what Nuzzo does. Her argument is that Kant does not derive right from anything prior to it. He rather introduces the concept as a postulate ex novo -- no doubt a product of reason, but one which already has a real content as object (though not an empirical one). Inasmuch as there is a deduction of the concept, this is only "metaphysical" in Kant's technical sense that it explains or expounds (analytically in the contemporary sense, I would gloss) the concept's meaning. Specifically, it makes explicit that human nature is its object; as such, therefore, that the concept is subject to sensible conditions. Kant's philosophy of right thus falls, according to Nuzzo, within the ambit of the transcendental anthropology which Kant develops -- notably but not exclusively in the third Critique -- in order to mediate the distance separating pure reason and actual experience. From the standpoint of method, it thus stands under the rubric of application, namely of otherwise pure concepts of reason to actual experience. This is done by way of postulation, not derivation.

Fichte's case is different. Here a transcendental deduction is indeed attempted, and Nuzzo (but so also Allen Wood) draws a parallel between Fichte's deduction of right and Kant's deduction of the categories in the first Critique. But here lies the problem. To the extent that the parallel truly holds, then one extends to Fichte's deduction of right the same disability which affects the deduction in the first Critique (and which Salomon Maimon was the first to call attention to in his usual eccentric fashion). There is of course a difference between the sphere of the theoretical and the practical to which the two deductions respectively belong. The one stands under the rule of the "I think": intelligibility is its norm; the other, under the rule of Fichte's Tathandlung: effectiveness of action is the norm. But, mutatis mutandis, the problem is the same. One may assume from the start that experience is intelligible, and also shot through with free agency. In that case, however, all purported transcendental arguments are in fact phenomenological expositions of the structure of experience -- "metaphysical" in Kant's sense. The absolute "I" is an ideal fiction only devised for bringing out a particular feature of this structure. (Cf. Gabriel Gottlieb's contribution.) Alternatively, one may start with a reason which ex hypothesi transcends the circumstances of human nature, i.e., one which is per se not affected by the senses. In that case, however, any attempt at demonstrating that experience in fact reflects that reason would amount to no more than just an interpretation, an idealizing construction. There cannot be any prima facie evidence that experience is de facto informed by a rationality which ex hypothesi transcends it, or that, when it comes to actual experience, Hume's type of psychology (as Maimon suggested) would not have to be the norm.

One can sympathize, therefore, with the contributors' tendency to conflate the "transcendental" and the "metaphysical" (in Kant's sense), in effect interpreting Fichte's deduction of the concept of right as a phenomenological exposition of all that goes into the very human social relation of right. Nuzzo herself concludes that the difference between Kant's and Fichte's theories ultimately lies in their respective ideas of the sphere of the practical. Whereas for Kant this sphere is defined by rationality in general, such as applies to all presumed rational beings, for Fichte it is defined from the start with reference to human rationality, qualified as this is by the presence of sensible nature. But then, would it not all the more follow that (to use Nuzzo's distinction) Fichte's science of right should begin with a postulate, not a transcendental deduction?

This, however, cannot be the whole story. As of 1796, Fichte's thought was still beholden to transcendental idealism, and this idealism is reflected in his phenomenology. Here I come to my other difficulty, for which I turn to Franks's contribution ("Fichte's kabbalistic realism"). According to Franks, the synthesis of infinite projection and bounding, such as is realized in Fichte's summon, exhibits

the [Luriac] logic of zimzum: the absolute and infinite I can coexist with the finite, and Fichte's Holistic Monist system can thereby avoid [the] nihilism [Jacobi accuses it of] -- insofar as the absolute I is self-limiting, which does not compromise its infinity and is in fact the only way in which the absolute I can be intelligible as infinite (111).

Franks gives good reasons, historical as well as conceptual, for reading German Idealism in the context of the tradition of the kabbala, even though I would be more comfortable if the post-1800 Schelling were at issue here -- or at least the post-1800 Fichte. It is noteworthy that in 1804 Fichte required "attention," which like "summon" is a way of being actively receptive, as the attitude his auditors had to assume with respect to the Light (a kabbalistic trope) with which, at the time, Fichte had replaced the "I" as the principle of his Science.

Be that as it may, Franks's contribution prominently includes the figure of Jacobi, the one historically responsible for initiating the discourse of recognition which Fichte's summon presupposes. But the point which is not made is that for Jacobi the presence of the "other" was immediate and irreducible, always already there, in need of no inference. Only philosophers would have thought it needed inference. But then, philosophers had the unfortunate habit, according to Jacobi, of walking on their heads. Moreover, at least in 1787, Jacobi strongly suggested that such a presence originates in the body -- as does reason also, which is to be developed precisely from the body up. (John Russon suggests the same in a contribution which appears much more Hegelian in spirit than Fichtean.)

This cannot be the case for Fichte, for whom, because of still transcendental assumptions regarding reason and freedom, nature in general, and the human body in particular, are ideas, that need deduction a priori. This must make a difference, if not to Fichte's concept of the relation of right as such, which is brilliant and still relevant to contemporary discussions (cf. Michael Nance's and Jean-Christophe Merle's contributions), certainly to how one conceives the originary communal structure which provides the relation's Sitz im Leben, the existential context that calls for it and in which the relation works itself out. I suspect that Wood and Russon are too rash comparing Fichte's phenomenology of "face" with Levinas', which is religiously motivated. For Fichte, "face" is a subject's internally motivated idealising projection. For Levinas, it constitutes rather a self-revelatory and independently imposing presence. Fichte's social theory is a priori committed to what James aptly calls an egotism of "personal freedom" -- nothing empirical or psychological, but the product rather of an idealizing commitment. One has reason to wonder what kind of community such an egotism would create. This is at bottom the concern motivating the Hegel-inspired criticisms of Fichte, which should not be taken lightly. But then, as Fichte would be the first to admit, one's community is the one one deserves.

None of this should be taken as standing in the way of my opening judgement. I know of no other collection of studies on Fichte's philosophy of natural right as well nuanced and balanced, and as uniformly insightful, as the present. It makes an excellent guide to Fichte's thought.