Fictional Characters, Real Problems: The Search for Ethical Content in Literature

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Garry L. Hagberg (ed.), Fictional Characters, Real Problems: The Search for Ethical Content in Literature, Oxford University Press, 2016, 389pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198715719.

Reviewed by Ole Martin Skilleås, University of Bergen


In order to describe the unifying theme of this collection of essays from prominent academics working in the field of philosophy and literature, Garry L. Hagberg resorts to ocular metaphors. They are to provide us with a vision, he says, of how ethical considerations are intertwined with diverse forms of literary expression. As the title indicates, fictional characters face the same problems as real people. What then, are the benefits and problems, if any, of investigating these problems through fictional events and situations faced by equally fictional characters? The eighteen essays investigate in ways that are no less diverse than the literary expressions they to varying degrees are concerned with, and this is a source of both strengths and weaknesses. In what follows I will give at least an idea of what each essay contributes to the collection, give my verdict on what I think of the book as a whole, but also challenge some of the assumptions in some of the essays, and in the collection as a whole.

In the first essay Nora Hämäläinen gives us a useful taxonomy of how literature has been used in moral philosophy. The first kind, the thin use, is surely the most widespread but also the least interesting. Literary narratives are used as illustrations -- almost as extended thought experiments. We are all familiar with the trolley problem. Similar thought experiments in ethics and moral philosophy cannot, on account of their brevity, provide much of the wider context of life which may have an impact on the choices we make. Some literary fictions are widely known, and time may be saved by reference to shared background knowledge. But not only that, of course. The sheer length of a literary narrative, and the rich complexity of character and situation, allows something more lifelike to emerge. As one would expect, there are no contributions in this volume that fit the criteria for the thin use of literature in moral philosophy.

The second kind is the thick use of literature in moral philosophy, exemplified by Martha Nussbaum's discussions about Antigone in The Fragility of Goodness. The literary work does not serve as an illustration of a point developed separately; the point is rather developed through a close attention to the texture of the literary text with a focus on features relevant to moral questions that could not be expressed in the prose of the normal philosophical text. The narrative text thus becomes a prime mover of the philosophical text rather than just an illustration. This second kind is surely what many people working with philosophy and literature aspire to achieve -- to tease great philosophy out of great literature -- but a reader of this second kind of work may sometimes suspect that the literary works have been tortured into confessing the philosophy that the writer had in mind all along.

Hämäläinen's third category, the open-ended use of literature, is illustrated by Cora Diamond's commentary on J. M. Coetzee's The Lives of Animals. This is even more of a novelty -- and not only in this volume. The task is to take the insights of the literary work on board and let them matter for how one goes about addressing questions in philosophy in the future. The literary work is thus not, as it were, translated into philosophy.

Hämäläinen's second category, the thick use of literature, is well illustrated by Robert B. Pierce's 'Hamlet and Moral Agency.' It presents a reading showing that Hamlet does not have a stance on the reality and nature of human choice -- as is so often assumed -- but rather that it dramatizes the all too human experiences from which we all, characters and people, develop our theories about ethical responsibility and its metaphysical underpinnings. The play thus becomes more an expression of the perplexity and bewilderment in our interactions with the world than an answer to the questions it raises. The essay is an example of the 'thick use of literature' to the extent that the focus remains on the play, and the thematic dynamics of the play, but the theme is more existential or even metaphysical than it is ethical or moral. Pierce's essay, however, is no worse for it.

Pierce is not alone in mining Hamlet. Tony Gash in 'The Dialogic Self in Hamlet: On How Dramatic Form Transforms Philosophical Inquiry' aims to demonstrate that the play shows us how the self of Hamlet and of other key characters is always already situated in a dialogic relation to other characters. It is Shakespeare's experience of the theatre that enabled him to make this contribution to the study of the composition of the self. Gash is able, through a perceptive reading of the play, to show key situations in a new light. Hamlet the character is no longer the prime example of interior subjectivity or the player of multiple roles, but a model of the dialogic structure of the self. Again it is hard to see that this contributes much to the search for the ethical content in literature, but it has other merits.

Dialogue, or at least 'conversation,' is also the key term in Richard Dawson's '"The Power of Conversation": Jane Austen's Persuasion and Hans-Georg Gadamer's Philosophical Hermeneutics.' Unfortunately, the essay promises more than it delivers. There are some auspicious initial overtures from the works of Gadamer, but the whole thing fails to gel in the end. The essay peters out in long quotations from Austen and lengthy explanations of the plot. One rather suspects that the conjunction of the title seemed like a very good idea at the planning stage, but that the attempts to work it out came to nothing.

There are many contributions that address the collection's main issues in ways that do not flow, as it were, from fictional literature. While literary examples are used, it would be wrong to classify them under Hämäläinen's first category. Eileen John's 'Caring about Characters' claims that we do, in fact, care about fictional characters. We are thus susceptible to loss and benefit in relation to them. How is this possible, given that we know full well that that they do not exist? John appears to follow Jenefer Robinson's view in Deeper than Reason that emotional responses are prior to cognitive appraisal of such matters as the metaphysical status (existent or non-existent) of what one responds to. John goes one further, one might say, in claiming that emotions can be triggered by 'interests at stake.' We care about these as representations, not as people. In doing so, we foreground aspects of ourselves that we have in common with fictional characters. These serve, according to John, as occasions for representational activities that turn out more intense than our representational activities in relation to real people.

One may quibble at this point, however, and ask how this conclusion can be reached without any serious attempt at comparisons between fictional literary examples and written accounts of the lives of real people. John handles fictions by Hardy, Nabokov and Coetzee with precision and ease, but I wish conclusions about the fictionality of the representations could have been backed up by comparisons with representations of non-fictional characters. The fictional characters are an occasion for manifesting an ordinary activity -- that of putting into words how people are in various situations, and we have strong interests at stake in this activity. So John's conclusion is that we do indeed have 'a basis for caring about the representational activity manifest in literary characters.'

Like Pierce before him, Hagberg also stays close to Shakespeare in 'Othello's Paradox: The Place of Character in Literary Experience'. Hagberg comes close to saying that ethical character and literary characters should be seen to be two sides of the same coin, and from the start we are made aware that Iago is one illustration of this as he exemplifies the Aristotelian point about forming character through actions. We are, as readers, also developing our characters through the literary characters since we develop our perceptual acuity through the subtle distinctions the best literary works teach us. Hagberg refers to Raimond Gaita's A Common Humanity, and supports the reported claim from this book that to be fully human we must learn to explore the difference between the real and the counterfeit in our inner life. For Hagberg this is not only part of the rich experience that literature affords, but also 'even constitutive of character' (p. 68).

This is a strong claim. Soul searching is beset with many difficulties, and one of these is that the witnesses, the lawyers, the jury and the judge are one and the same. Is the search for the real and the counterfeit in our own souls really most ably assisted by the pursuit of literary fictions in which everything -- the characters, their influences, actions and the eventual outcome is directed by one and the same person? One may agree that the very best literary fictions, Shakespeare's among them, offer ample material for considering many aspects of ethical life. But it is a different matter to agree with Hagberg that made-up stories, where the author controls everything, should be the litmus test of the real and the counterfeit in our own souls. It is at the very least a dubious principle to use the fictitious to judge the real.

Hagberg writes that 'the same need for truth (as a need of the soul) drives our concern for seeing literary characters as they are, for understanding them across an expanse of time and circumstance, of seeing the word-borne identities revealed in the virtues and vices they show in their thought, action, and style of interaction' (p. 70). Here again it is as if Hagberg forgets that the need for truth cannot be served by thoughts not had, actions not carried out and styles of interaction not acted out. Literary characters are not 'as they are'; they are only as portrayed by their authors.

But it is hard to deny that modern educated people's views of character and of our own inner lives are in part influenced by fictions. Perhaps we do, like the Cambridge ladies of e.e. cummings' poem, live in furnished souls -- souls furnished by some of the literary giants. However, it is one thing to be influenced by literary fictions and their characters, and another to use these fictions as evidence for the characters of living and breathing people.

It has long been a worry of mine that we, as academics with a literary bent, may be too ready to accept arguments to the effect that reading literature will make us better people. Smugness comes in many forms, and this could be one of them. Given that the human cognitive condition is riddled with phenomena like confirmation bias and belief resilience, there is every reason to be skeptical of views that implicitly award us a halo.

A further worry is that literary fictions are just fictions. They are the products of one mind, and not evidence of how the real world is. What we learn from fictions is about those fictions, and any further inferences depend on the veracity of those fictions. From literature we learn about literary characters and how they think, feel and act, and what further consequences those actions have on the other literary characters in this fiction. Any learning about the real world or real people from these fictions relies on the premise that the literary characters are indeed like people in the real world, and that the ways situations play out in these fictions are indeed veridical. How can this possibly come about?

Daniel Brudney's very interesting 'The Breadth of Moral Character' may have the answer. His contribution is unusual in that the philosophical perspective is derived from Kant rather than the far more prevalent perspective of Aristotle. However, it would be more correct to say that the perspective is from Barbara Herman's Moral Literacy (2007). Herman's Kant is nuanced and sophisticated, and her focus is on what it is for a will to be good. Her crucial move is that it is part of the good will to be perceptive of, and open to, the morally relevant features of a situation.

Brudney claims that a literary example is more compelling than a constructed philosophical example (p. 256), but seems to forget that the literary example is no less constructed. It is not normally constructed to prove a point in ethics, but given that there are a vast number of literary fictions out there -- even good ones -- a well-read or computer-savvy academic can surely find one work of literary fiction that can be easily read so that is 'proves' the point that needs proving.

Brudney's answer would be that the literary fiction needs to be credible to work at all. Successful literary characters are therefore typical of human psychology. This is The Poetics all over again, of course. The cases of real people, however, can more easily be dismissed as aberrant according to Brudney -- a view in keeping with the saying that truth is stranger than fiction. But hang on a minute -- how typical are Oedipus, Humbert Humbert, Macbeth or Raskolnikov? People are drawn to the shocking and exciting, the novel and the unexpected, and this goes for the fictional characters we find interesting too. It is one thing to say that these, and other famous literary characters, act in ways in keeping with their characters and situations, but are they not 'aberrant'? I really hope they are! One may say that the situations in which they find themselves are unlikely to be typical, but (in keeping with the copious explanatory powers of The Poetics) that the way their personalities interact with their environment makes the plot not only likely, but bordering on inevitable.

We may compare and contrast fictions with biographies and autobiographies. No matter how strange the people portrayed or writing about their lives may appear to be, they can at least teach us something new. If something new about human beings is learnt from a fictional character, the novel view or perspective has to come with the added premise that 'this is actually how people think, feel and behave in general, and not just this particular figment of the author's imagination.' Even so, this verdict can only be made by the readers or spectators, and thus based on a previously held view or perspective on human character and how people in general respond to their environments. Is it then only a case of these outstanding fictions reminding us of what we believe and hold be true -- in general -- about human character and the events people face?

Many -- far too many -- of these essays fail to say clearly what they are about, or what they try to achieve, and readers are left as flotsam on surging tides of erudite explication. Along with Brudney's essay, J. Jeremy Wisnewski's 'The Moral Relevance of Literature and the Limits of Argument: Lessons from Heidegger, Aristotle, and Coetzee' stands out as an exception. Wisnewski excels in the virtue of saying clearly from the start what it is he is proposing -- even if it is that propositions and arguments are powerless to change our moral points of view. He uses Heidegger, Aristotle and Coetzee to argue in a vigorously sane manner that moral change is the product of a changed way of seeing, and literature provides a much better source for the change in vision this requires than does philosophy.

Richard Eldridge writes about 'The Question of Truth in Literature'. Unlike Wisnewski he does not do much to provide the reader with any hints about where this is going, or what he tries to achieve, but it turns out that when Frege, post-Fregeans, Nelson Goodman, and Heidegger have been examined and found wanting, the Geist of Hegel emanates from the ruins of the failed theories. The real moral problems, though, and the fictional characters, are notably absent. Jonathan Strauss's 'An Endless Person: Heidegger, Breton, and Nadja at the Limits of Language' is a reading of a literary work in the context of a philosopher unknown by the work's author. At the fore is the question of identity, and the surrealism of Breton is brought into an arranged marriage with Heidegger's Dasein-analysis. It quickly becomes, to me at least, an exercise in plays on words and abstruse allusions to obscure theories. It is at best very tangentially relevant to the book's stated theme and purpose .

Noël Carroll is not a surprising member of the cast of a collection such as this. In 'Character, Social Information, and the Challenge of Psychology,' he maintains that characters in the fictional world can be sources of social information in the real world despite the arguments and empirical studies underpinning 'situationism.' Literature, on this score, still has carry-over application to everyday living not least since much social information is normative -- a view he develops with close reference to the novel and the film The Big Country.

Mitchell S. Green provides a clear and scrupulous discussion in 'Learning To Be Good (or Bad) in (or Through) Literature' that points out that literary characters negotiate moral obstacles in ways that are both morally admirable and objectionable, but that we can learn from both. Literature can make us both bad and good, and this duality has often been neglected by writers in this field.

Stephen Mulhall's 'Quartet: Wallace's Wittgenstein, Moran's Amis' is in many ways an attempt to develop a Wittgensteinian literary analysis of the emergence of the ethical self. We see Mulhall trying to preserve the uniqueness of both philosophy and literature, while exploring challenges they have in common. In 'Emma's Extravagance: Jane Austen and the Character-Situation Debate,' Valerie Wainwright reads Austen's novel into the current situation-character debate by showing the intricate manner in which Austen delineates her heroine's conduct. She suggests that what looks like Emma's surprising behaviour towards Mr. Knightly can also be linked to an attractive combination of personality traits. While the essay may be of chief interest to Janeites, a take-home message for us others may be that even the most agreeable characters cannot be just or prudent all the way through.

Austen's novels are popular among contributors to Hagberg's collection. Alan H. Goldman ('Moral Development in Pride and Prejudice') works out the general picture of Aristotelian moral philosophy and psychology over the first few pages. He then goes on to tackle psychological theories of different kinds, before pointing out that these theories are not based on empirical work following the same individuals over time but only several characters at the same time. Austen in Pride and Prejudice, however, does show moral development in her characters over time. But hang on a little -- can fictional characters count as individuals? Can they do any useful work explaining the moral development of people of the flesh-and-blood variety? Imagine a research proposal where the purpose is to develop reliable theories of human character and action, and where the part outlining the empirical method simply says that because it's so hard to find people we can follow over time (and expensive too), we are going to just sit down and read some novels.

Maybe this is unfair to Goldman's thoughtful essay and his slightly modified Aristotelianism, but one may easily get the feeling that one has entered a loop where theories of moral development are presented and then tried out on fictional characters and -- would you believe it -- they fit perfectly. People, however, are far too troublesome to investigate and remain well out of the loop. Since Goldman's empirical material in his theory of moral development is fictional characters and not people, the theory is one of literary criticism rather than moral psychology. That theories match a literary work only shows that the author, on this interpretation, implicitly subscribes to the same theory of moral development, or to one (more or less explicit) that gives the same results.

While some of these essays read a bit like good old moral literary criticism, there are some essays towards the end that do not address literary works at all. This sixth and final section is called 'Historical Genealogies of Moral-Aesthetic Concepts.' Martin Donougho in 'Shaftesbury as Virtuoso' reads Shaftesbury into the context of Italian court life in the fifteenth century. This makes it all the clearer why the social mechanisms of distinction matter also for aesthetic distinction and how some practices, but not others, acquire their value as art, but I struggled to see the connections with the theme of this book.

Jules Brody's 'Fate, Philology, Freud 'at least deals with a concept, fate, that is central to literature and moral life. I must admit that I at first failed to see the relevance of Freud, but Brody draws the kind of long and revealing lines that make one feel truly enlightened. Fate is effortlessly explained through reason and morality, and the ancient Greek conceptions of fate and reason meet their modern transformation through Freud into what we might call the folk psychology of today (my reading, not Brody's). The essay is light on literary input, but is a fitting finale to this collection all the same.

Humberto Brito's 'In Praise of Aristotle's Poetics' is one of the collection's gems. Brito points out that the well-known debate about the correct understanding of katharsis started out five centuries ago as a translation issue. He is less interested in this, and wants to capture the explanatory continuum given intelligibility by Aristotle's account of poiêtikê technê. Brito claims that the point of The Poetics is to provide an inquiry into the modes of correctness of a philosophically exciting kind of craft knowledge -- not the function of tragedy as such. There are some things that philosophers have had a hard time explaining, and that is how a common êthos is achieved. Brito's reading shows how it is that shared reactions come about, and this is, he says, a way of giving intelligibility to the very existence of a common êthos.

The rich variety of this collection contains both disappointments and delights, irritation over the turgid prose of one contribution turns into the delightful realisation that the next one provides a surprising insight, and so on. I found myself engrossed by some essays I had more or less written off on the slender evidence of the title, while others failed to live up to their promise. This makes it difficult to come up with a verdict of the book as a whole. Other readers will perhaps give opposite verdicts on the same essays, but we are more likely to agree on the style. Some essays start out by keeping quiet about what is at stake, and about what is going to happen, and though these essays are invariably erudite, one is unlikely to be much enlightened about anything much after reading them. Other contributions are models of clarity and beacons of enlightenment, and one sympathises with editors who are, like all of us, powerless to turn base metal into gold.

It is unfair to criticize Hagberg for not editing a different book, so I won't, but maybe this field needs some new questions and perspectives. Could we not have learnt about real problems and gained ethical content from autobiographies or biographies? After all, literary fictions behave in exactly the way the author decides, and how situations pan out is directed by the fingers of the author on the keyboard. A further problem with philosophers theorizing about how one should live one's life through the lens of literary fictions is that an overly intellectualistic picture of moral life emerges. Given the title and purpose of this book, it may be seen as a missed opportunity to have plenty of references in the index to 'Austen' and 'authenticity', but none at all to 'autobiography.' If one searches for ethical content in literature, and a majority of contributors do, shouldn't there be at least some attempts to 'compare and contrast' the real problems of fictional characters and those of real people?