Finding Ourselves at the Movies: Philosophy for a New Generation

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Paul W. Kahn, Finding Ourselves at the Movies: Philosophy for a New Generation, Columbia University Press, 2013, 239pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780231164382.

Reviewed by Sarah Cooper, King's College London


In film scholarship, there is a long-standing history of interest in that crucial yet enigmatic point of intersection between the cinema and the world beyond its walls, as well as between the movies and their spectators. From interrogation of cinematic realism, through audience studies, to painstakingly detailed psychoanalytic theoretical study of spectatorship, and in research into the political, moral, and ethical effects of the moving image, the relationship between our world, ourselves, and the movies we view has received a great deal of scrutiny and continues to be a key area of concern within film studies today. Paul W. Kahn's elegant book is a fascinating intervention in this area of interest, which addresses from a philosophical perspective the question of how we might find ourselves at the movies.

One of Kahn's stated ambitions is to write a book that is not aimed at the professional audience of scholars from philosophy or from film studies, but which addresses a different, far broader audience. By focusing deliberately on contemporary cinematic releases that his intended readership might have found playing at the local cinema from the 1990s onwards (and will be likely to find on DVD now, as well as playing in cinema programmes in years to come), he talks his readers through a series of connections between us and the movies we see, by relating film to philosophy in a manner that serves to widen the appeal of philosophy. Kahn's erudition is everywhere apparent, his text is clearly written and he avoids jargon, yet he does not shy away from complex argument, nor does he oversimplify his philosophical material, which provides him with the key issues that he addresses in his text. His book divides neatly into two sections: in the first he aims to consider how popular film permits the exploration of the nature of action and interpretation, and in the second part he is interested in how popular film explores narratives of politics, family, and faith.

The power and importance of story telling is apparent throughout Kahn's text, and his interest in the close relationship between what the films present and what questions we think about in our lives underpins his argument from the outset. One of the first films under discussion in the first chapter, The Artist (Hazanavicius, 2011), permits Kahn to show how we might offer a narrative not unlike that put forward in this film if asked to explain our lives or the lives of others. Arguing that one's opinion of a film such as this relies on an entire world of meaning that makes both film and life make sense, he suggests that understanding the nature of this world is the task of philosophy.

Following on from this opening where the stakes of his project are clearly set out, the second and third chapters dovetail neatly, addressing philosophical problems of action and knowledge. These first three chapters comprise the section that Kahn suggests readers concentrate on if their interest is in philosophy. In the second chapter, and with recourse to detailed discussion of Atom Egoyan's The Sweet Hereafter (1997), along with fleeting reference to other films to make his case, Kahn explores the nature of freedom. Kahn argues persuasively that philosophy does not instruct us how to behave but that it does show how our choices are situated in a world of meanings and values through which we find our own way. The enquiry into the imagination in this chapter focuses on action as being able to understand what it is to persuade and be persuaded. In the third chapter, the focus shifts from action to interpretation and considers the important place that narrative and its interpretation occupy in our lives. Kahn interweaves discussion of a range of films -- Hidden (Haneke, 2005), Memento (Nolan, 2000), The Other Man (Eyre, 2008), The Box (Kelly, 2009) -- to show how, both inside and outside of the cinema, imaginative projects of narrative construction inform our engagement with the world and with others, as well as playing an important role in how we present ourselves to the world.

In the final three chapters of the book -- the section to which he recommends those interested in film may wish to turn -- Kahn explores films from a selection of genres (the slasher film, romantic comedy, and pornography) in order to give a sense of the social imaginary through which we create meaning in the world. Kahn is not interested in showing how the social imagination works, but in examining its products, one of which is film. Contemporary popular cinema provides the context for the examination of themes of love, sacrifice, and rebirth in this second section. Placing faith in the way in which narrative organizes our world, Kahn affirms across the final three chapters, through a range of compelling film analyses, that the cinematic dream world is one in which we need to trust. Rather than suggest that we receive from film indoctrination in terms of how we should live, Kahn argues that the way in which we engage with film narrative shows how we give meaning and sustain meaning both inside and outside of the cinema. His concern throughout these final chapters is to do philosophy in order to show what it can be in this contemporary cinematic context, which links throughout to the lives of those who view, act, and think.

The desire to re-energize philosophical enquiry through recourse to film is evident from the outset where Kahn shows in lucid terms the relevance of philosophical questions far beyond the institutionalized, disciplinary academic study of philosophy, and calls for it to engage wonder and be exciting. He argues that there is a need for a new direction in philosophical enquiry, and this is certainly what he paves the way towards in his text. Readers well versed in the burgeoning academic field of film and philosophy may, however, find themselves wanting to see a broader engagement with the wealth of literature on the intersection of film and philosophy that already addresses matters close to the heart of what Kahn is considering in his text. Indeed, Kahn perhaps has more allies in the field of study of film and philosophy than he realizes when he states the following: 'Until and unless philosophy gets out of the ivory towers and back into the streets, it will continue its slow death from lack of care and, even worse, lack of respect.' (p. 28) Those scholars researching at the intersection between film and philosophy have begun this work of thinking about philosophy and popular cinema, perhaps with different ends in mind, but nonetheless with a desire to think about how each benefits the other; philosophy has already left the ivory tower within this energizing field.

The turn to film that Kahn advocates in his opening chapter and throughout the text will thus be welcome within this field of interest in film and philosophy. He is not speaking from the perspective of a philosopher who looks down on film, nor is he using his filmic case studies only illustratively. Rather, he views film on a par with other things in our lives, and the meaning making that he understands to bind film to our lives does not instate a disciplinary hierarchy between philosophy and film. Yet in spite of the welcome absence of a hierarchical view of film from a philosophical perspective, there is a notable absence of emphasis on the specifically filmic qualities of the films under discussion. Although film narrative is a central thread that runs throughout his text, there is little discussion of the manner in which film tells its tales using the formal features that make these narratives possible and so compelling. At times, the film narratives that Kahn discusses sound no different from literary narratives, since there is no mention of the language or apparatus of cinema. Film is important to Kahn because of its themes and the capacity of these themes to engage the audience with them, and a more sustained focus on form as well as on the cinematic apparatus would serve to make more of the specificity of his object of study and our mediated approach to the stories it tells.

These points aside, Kahn's work is rich, thought provoking, and will inspire much further discussion. He has written a book that is both sophisticated in its philosophical argument and accessible to an intelligent, non-specialist readership. Finding Ourselves at the Movies will be of keen interest to scholars working in the field of film and philosophy, and constitutes a valuable addition to this area of scholarship.