Formal Causes: Definition, Explanation, and Primacy in Socratic and Aristotelian Thought

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Michael T. Ferejohn, Formal Causes: Definition, Explanation, and Primacy in Socratic and Aristotelian Thought, Oxford University Press, 2013, 211pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199695300.

Reviewed by James G. Lennox, University of Pittsburgh


Aristotle refers to Socrates by name only a few times, but a consistent picture emerges from those references. In Formal Causes, Michael Ferejohn draws on more than three decades of sustained investigation into the connection between the epistemological concerns of certain 'Socratic' dialogues and those animating Aristotle's Analytics. Aristotle's principal debt to Socrates, as Ferejohn sees it, is the idea that definitions both identify what things are and, by virtue of that identification, are also fundamental explanatory starting points -- formal causes -- and thus serve as epistemological foundations. The argument for the interpretation on offer is rigorous, clear and sustained. This is a must read for anyone concerned with Aristotle's theory of knowledge and its Academic roots.

The first half of the Introduction spells out some underlying presuppositions of its argument. Ferejohn discusses the odd "transtemporal philosophical exchange" in which historians of philosophy engage with their subjects, and segues into a nuanced discussion of Aristotle as one such historian of philosophy, engaged in two quite different exchanges with two very different kinds of predecessor -- Platonists and Natural Philosophers -- and at two different stages of his career. The book is largely structured around two themes discussed in this introduction: (i) Aristotle runs with a number of key ideas that he (Aristotle) attributes to Socrates; and (ii) Aristotle goes through a three stage development from a logico-metaphysical thinker, to a natural philosopher, to a stage in which he attempts to integrate the achievements of the first two, which for Ferejohn represent fundamentally different conceptual frameworks: "despite a certain superficial similarity between the notions of essence in the Organon and nature in the physical works, the former is essentially a logical and epistemological concept, whereas the latter is a causal, or physical concept." (17)

Much of the evidence for theme (i) comes from the portraits of Socrates painted by Plato and Aristotle, and Ferejohn's argument depends on there being a consistent picture from these two sources. For Aristotle's view we are directed to two well-known passages in the Metaphysics (Α.6 987b1-3, Μ.4 1078b22-30).[1] It is especially in the second that we have the key 'Socratic' idea that Ferejohn sees Aristotle developing in the Analytics -- that statements identifying essences (definitions) also serve as starting points for deductive proof (in particular, demonstration).

Ferejohn does not discuss the other theme shared by these two passages, however: the failure of Socrates to extend this method beyond ethics to natural inquiry (cf. 1078b17-20). Not only is this failure  emphasized in both these passages, but also in a Socratic reference Ferejohn doesn't mention, Parts of Animals I.1, 642a24-31. Here Aristotle notes that, under Socrates' influence, interest in 'what it is to be something' and in 'defining the being of things' emerged, but philosophers turned away from natural inquiry toward ethics and politics. In these passages, Aristotle implies that he is the first philosopher to pursue natural inquiry with these Socratic tools in hand. This is a message quite congenial to one of Ferejohn's central themes: that Aristotle self-identifies as a disciple of Socrates in this crucial respect.  But it raises questions about his developmental thesis, since it suggests that his natural inquiries were not developed independently of his logical inquiries, but with those inquiries very much in mind.

Besides establishing the thematic framework for the book, the Introduction also engages in the more standard chapter-by-chapter outline of the book's argument -- but with more care and detail than is typically the case.

I turn now to an overview of that argument. The first chapter focuses on the Socratic interest in definition, and is heavily influenced by Ferejohn's distinction of "three grades of epistemological involvement" (21-24). On the account of these three grades given here, many of the discussions in the 'early' dialogues don't count as epistemology at all -- they are often just ad hominem challenges to claims of expertise. Occasionally, however, and especially in the Euthyphro and Meno, Socrates rises to 'Grade 1', in virtue of suggesting that knowing the essence of F is a necessary condition of knowing anything else about F or of recognizing instances of F (28-31).[2] Ferejohn argues that this self-consciously epistemic focus emerges naturally out of earlier concerns with the question of what counts as expertise; once it is suggested that the mark of an expert is a special knowledge of a subject, a natural question is 'What is the mark of knowledge possession?'. This chapter concludes with a lengthy detour into the literature surrounding Peter Geach's 'Socratic Fallacy', which I found more distracting than illuminating.

A Grade 2 epistemologist will provide an analysis of knowledge that aims to articulate principles for distinguishing knowledge from the chance possession of true beliefs, and in chapter 2 Ferejohn argues that such an analysis is provided implicitly in the Euthyphro and explicitly in the Meno.[3] The view articulated in these dialogues is that definitional knowledge provides explanatory grounds for all other knowledge. This conclusion is, of course, the pivotal step in Ferejohn's argument that Aristotle's analysis of knowledge in the Posterior Analytics is a natural development of the Grade 2 epistemology in these dialogues.

The remaining chapters aim to show the ways in which Aristotle develops and enriches this Socratic legacy: "the central insight that drives the entire project of Aristotle's Analytics is the Platonic idea, briefly floated in Meno 98 A, that what distinguishes knowledge from other types of true belief is that it is somehow 'tied down' by the possession of an explanatory account." (66) In chapter 3, against the background of the Socratic theory of definition, explanation and their relationship, Ferejohn develops a distinctive picture of the first book of the Posterior Analytics, according to which there is a fundamental difference between chapters 1-3 and the remainder of the book. The goal of APo. I.1-3 is to articulate "pre-theoretical constraints on the possession of scientific knowledge" (81); what follows is the presentation of a theory of syllogistic demonstration that satisfies these constraints. The constraints come in the form of the stringent epistemic conditions placed on the premises of a demonstration articulated and defended in APo. I.2 -- that they must be true, primary, immediate, and more knowable than, prior to and causative of the conclusion. Those constraints are further strengthened by the insistence, in chapters 4-5, that the premises in canonical demonstrations not just be universal but what Ferejohn dubs 'cathólic' predications -- in which predicates of demonstrative premises belong to their subjects per se and as such. Should these conditions on the premises be met, a demonstration will establish that an attribute belongs necessarily to its subject. Ferejohn's understanding of these conditions is controversial, and I will return to it later. On this basis, the rest of the Analytics then provides a model for the sciences, that is, a philosophy of science.

In order for the Analytics to be developing the Socratic program described in chapter 2, however, definitions must be central to demonstrative explanation -- and since, for Aristotle, demonstrative explanations are causal explanations (see constraint 6), there must be an intimate connection between definitions and causes. The goal of chapter 4 is to make the case that there is a canonical model of 'definition based' demonstration in which middle terms identify essences that are cathólically predicated of their subjects, and that explain why other cathólically predicated features belong to those subjects as such (102-108). After a brief discussion of II.19 on coming to know first principles (108-110), Ferejohn's exposition of the canonical model (115-119) concludes by pointing out an oddity, too often passed over, in Aristotle's presentation of his paradigm of such a demonstration -- the demonstration that angles equal to two right angles (2R) belongs per se to all triangles, qua triangles. Aristotle is strangely silent on a crucial piece of information, without which there is no canonical demonstration: the defining essence of triangle, in virtue of which 2R belongs to them as such, is never identified! Though I have a very different take on Aristotle's reasons for this silence, Ferejohn's discussion of this puzzle is valuable.

Implicit in referring to the model of demonstration discussed in chapter 4 as 'canonical', is the thought that Aristotle countenances 'non-canonical' demonstrations as well, and that subject is taken up in chapter 5. This chapter repays repeated readings. Two different types of 'non-canonical' demonstration are considered. In the first, the predication being explained is true, necessary but non-commensurate, e.g., '2R belongs to all scalene triangles', or 'Leaf-shedding belongs to all vines'.[4] Here context is crucial: if one already knows why 2R belongs to triangles per se, then a proof of the above conclusion is merely the application of a canonical demonstration to a sub-category of triangles, and that is the way Ferejohn considers them. Suppose, however, you have established that 2R belongs to all and only triangles, but you cannot yet explain why. In those circumstances, your claim to knowledge is sophistic (APo. I.5 74a28): since you don't know why triangles have 2R, you don't know why any specific form of triangle does either.

The other non-canonical form of demonstration, on Ferejohn's account, consists of cases in which the middle term is not a formal but an efficient cause, e.g., explanations of thunder, eclipses or leaf-shedding. Ferejohn sees a significant difference between the first two examples, which dominate the discussion in chapters 8-10, and the third, the discussion of which runs through chapters 16-17: in the former examples the explananda are occasional events in which the cause is external to the affected subject (cf. Metaph. Η.4 1044b10-15); whereas when, in chapter 17, Aristotle imagines a causal explanation for broad-leafed plants shedding their leaves it is, Ferejohn claims, a essential feature of the plants in question. This leads to an elaborate interpretation of these chapters (137-155) about which I will raise questions later.

As I noted earlier, there is a developmental thesis (nicely presented on 157-160) that is central to Ferejohn's argument, and the sixth and final chapter presents the case for a third phase of Aristotle's philosophical development as an 'integration' of ideas central to the preceding 'logical' and 'natural' phases. His case rests principally on a reading of Metaphysics Z-H, in which definition and essence, which he claims are relatively unimportant in Aristotle's natural science, return with a vengeance, but now in the context of understanding the unity of matter/form composites. In the end, however, he sees a tension between the notion of essence and definition ("formal causes") at the heart of Aristotle's Canonical Model of demonstration and of efficient/final causes at the heart of his natural science: "the tension in Aristotle's thought between viewing the world from the Platonic perspective and viewing it as a natural philosopher was still not entirely resolved, even when Aristotle composed the middle books of the Metaphysics" (195; and see 193).

As compelling as Ferejohn's argument is, questions can be raised about a number of its presuppositions. At the most global level is this thesis about Aristotle's philosophical development, which structures the overall narrative of the last four chapters. According to that thesis, Aristotle's philosophical career exhibits (i) a Platonic 'logico-metaphysical' stage, in which there is a 'thin' ontology underpinning a theory of predication and a canonical theory of demonstration in which the middle terms of demonstrations refer to defining essences or 'formal causes'; (ii) a stage during which Aristotle engages with the doctrines of earlier natural philosophers and develops an empirical science of nature in which the concepts of nature and efficient/final cause more or less replace the concept of defining essence; and (iii) a stage in which Aristotle seeks (though in the end fails) to integrate the results of these two earlier phases visible in the central books of the Metaphysics, De anima, and perhaps the ethical treatises.

Notwithstanding Ferejohn's denial (121n1) that the canonical/non-canonical distinction is not dependent on this developmental thesis, they become quite entangled in the chapters devoted to Aristotle: chapter 4 discusses the development of the canonical model of demonstration; chapter 5 emphasizes Aristotle's recognition of a 'non-canonical' form of demonstration exemplified by examples drawn from natural science in which middle terms are efficient causes; and chapter 6 focuses on Metaphysics Z-H, where Aristotle seeks to resolve problems concerning the unity of matter/form composites and their definitions by appeals both to the causal model of demonstration and to all four causes. As Ferejohn puts it:

the pivotal moment in Aristotle's intellectual development occurs when he abandons this earlier bifurcation of interests and philosophical approach and begins to develop a fully comprehensive philosophical system that incorporates results both from the logical inquiries of the Organon and from his subsequent physical inquiries in such works as the Physics. (160)

But was there an 'earlier bifurcation'? There are reasons to doubt it, and thus to doubt the need for an integration. Over the past forty years a great deal of work, primarily but not exclusively focused on Aristotle's animal investigations, has made a compelling case that the ideal of demonstration (in its 'canonical' form) defended in the Analytics is central to the way in which Aristotle presents the results of his natural inquiries. It is unfortunate, therefore, that the zoological works, and the philosophical literature focused on them, are all but ignored in this volume.[5] Since the zoological studies are clearly the heart and soul of Aristotle's natural science, any attempt to delineate the relationship between it and the Analytics without reference to his zoological works is problematic. In my view a strong case can be made that many of the methodological questions that structure PA I, the philosophical introduction to his zoology, are questions about how to apply the APo. account of science to the study of living things. And as the remarks about Socrates in PA I mentioned earlier show, an interest in essence and definition is fundamental to Aristotle's investigations of nature -- notwithstanding that the essences and definitions of matter/form composites will be different from those of geometric figures, as he repeatedly reminds us. All of this, and much more, suggests that Aristotle's investigations of nature were not kept separate from his logical investigations, creating a tension that needed to be resolved—though that the Analytics operates at a high level of abstraction and requires considerable enrichment in application to distinct subject domains I have no doubt.

Related questions can be raised about the 'canonical/non-canonical' distinction. There are a number of places where Aristotle uses paradigm cases of canonical demonstrations, and what Ferejohn takes to be paradigm cases of both kinds of non-canonical demonstrations side by side illustrate the same point. This is most obvious in APo. II.16-17. The aporia driving that discussion -- whether in demonstrations the terms referring to causes and their effects must convert -- begins with two examples, eclipses and leaf-shedding. The leaf-shedding example begins by considering a possible explanation of vines shedding their leaves because they are broad-leafed (98a35-b17). But that just gets inquiry to the level of a commensurately universal (cathólic) relation between broad leaves and leaf-shedding. At that point Aristotle pose a worry already discussed in APo. I.13 -- if these terms are commensurate, how do you determine which is the cause of which? But he answers the question with the eclipse example -- the earth being in the middle is definitory of eclipse, so it is the cause. Then, in the next chapter, Aristotle takes that commensurately universal connection between broad leaves and leaf-shedding as the explanandum and supplies a possible cause for it. But he first makes the point using the example of exterior angles being equal to four right angles, noting that this property 'extends beyond' triangle and quadrangle but is co-extensive with the kind to which they belong, as too, he says, will be the middle term (as with 'triangle' and '2R', he never tells us what it is). He then makes precisely the same point with his botanical example. It is worth quoting:

Similarly for the middle term -- and the middle term is an account of the first extreme (which is why all the sciences come about through definitions). For example, shedding leaves both follows vine and extends beyond it, and follows fig and extends beyond it -- but not beyond all of them, but is equal [i.e. coextensive] to them. If you take the primitive middle term, it is an account of shedding leaves. For there will first be a middle term in the one direction (that all are such and such); and then a middle term for this (that the sap solidifies, or something of the sort). What is shedding leaves? The solidifying of the sap at the connection of the seed. (99a21-29)

Ferejohn finds this discussion multiply 'curious' (148, 153n46), as well he might. He first suggests that perhaps Aristotle is trying to replace a 'canonical, formal causal' demonstration presented in chapter 16 with a non-canonical efficient causal demonstration in chapter 17, but (rightly) rejects that possibility and concludes that the uses of the example in chapter 16 and in chapter 17 are in conflict. This seems highly unlikely, since this is one continuous discussion. By taking seriously that the context of all of book II is inquiry moving toward principles, we can see a deep continuity between this discussion and the early chapters of APo. I. Just as you can 'explain' why all isosceles triangles have 2R by noting that they are triangles, so you can 'explain' why all vines lose their leaves by noting that they are broad-leafed plants, all of which lose their leaves. But unless you know why all broad leafed plants lose their leaves, these are 'incidental' or 'sophistic' explanations (cf. 71b10-11, 74a29) -- and Aristotle makes it clear that this is what is going on in the above passage by noting that you can use 'broad-leafed' as the middle term for the application explanation, but you need a more primitive middle to demonstrate the connection between being broad leafed and leaf-shedding. And as he notes, like all such 'canonical' demonstrations, that middle is not only the cause, but in good Socratic fashion gives the account of the first extreme term. Not only is the example formally parallel to the discussion of 2R and triangles in APo. I 4-5 -- when first introduced in chapter 16 -- it is also taken to be directly comparable to the eclipse example of II.1-10. Once again, the causal middle term is an account (i.e., a definition) of the first extreme: just as whenever the earth comes between sunlight and the moon there is a lunar eclipse, so whenever the sap coagulates there is leaf-shedding. Leaf-shedding, after all, is (like eclipses and thunder) an occasional event that regularly happens to certain kinds of plants, not an eternally present property.

Thus, while these various discussions and the examples they rely on are clearly different, the 'canonical/non-canonical' and 'application/causal model' distinctions may be imposing a framework on the Analytics that in the end prevents us from understanding a deeper continuity in the Analytics project and between it and the scientific works.

Finally, let us return to another governing presupposition of Ferejohn's reading of the Analytics: the idea that the first three chapters (perhaps with a little help from chapter 4) articulate general logical/epistemological constraints on the possession of scientific knowledge, while the rest of APo. I provides a syllogistically based theory of demonstration based on premises that meet these constraints. This is, of course, to apply a template to the Analytics that fits comfortably with our distinction between epistemology and philosophy of science. But I wonder whether it fits the Analytics. The argument that the Analytics is developing a project at least hinted at in the Euthyphro and Meno is hard to resist. But that story fits well with a Posterior Analytics, which, from the very first page, is doing what we would have expected from reading the very first page of the Prior Analytics: establishing additional conditions on the premises of syllogistic proofs so that they provide us with causal demonstrations.[6] Ferejohn's alternative leads him to provide an extremely reductive account of the six 'constraints' discussed in chapter 2.  First he reformulates the three constraints that refer to how the premises relate to the conclusion so that they are absolute rather than relative (73), and in the end says that what appear to be six conditions are reducible to three: truth, immediacy, and epistemic primacy (74).[7] Moreover, immediacy (being 'unmiddled') is treated in purely extensional terms, yet this concept is defined in terms of demonstrative primacy (72a7-8). And this account of immediacy lies behind his claim that the as such condition on 'cathólic' predications in APo. I.4 is also extensional. Now Aristotle forges a very tight bond between being predicated per se and as such: "to hold of something per se and to hold of it as such are the same: e.g., point and straight hold of lines per se -- for they hold as lines; and two right angles hold of triangles as triangles -- for triangles are per se equal to two right angles" (73b29-33).

Yet Ferejohn claims the 'as such' condition is purely extensional, while the per se condition is intensional. As I understand what is at stake here, Aristotle is drawing attention to the fact that it is only once one understands a thing as such and such that one can determine which features of it are per se and which per accidens. Thus, while I am generally suspicious of trying to apply this distinction as currently understood to Aristotle, if I had to, I would say that the 'as such' condition establishes an intensional context for distinguishing different sorts of predication.

And here we return to the theme of Ferejohn's introduction. For he is among those contemporary scholars of Ancient Philosophy who seek to clarify it through the application of the conceptual tools of analytic philosophy. And while I am on board with the idea that historians of philosophy are and ought to be engaged in a 'transtemporal philosophical exchange' with our great predecessors, I worry that many contemporary categories and assumptions, often based on an explicit rejection of Aristotle's ways of doing things, sometimes obscure rather than illumine what he is up to.

That said, as is true of the very best work in the field of Ancient Philosophy, every reader of Formal Causes will reap rich rewards from grappling with this deeply informed and carefully argued work.


Lennox, James G. 1987. "Divide and Explain: The Posterior Analytics in Practice", in Allan Gotthelf and James G. Lennox (eds.), Philosophical Issues in Aristotle's Biology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 90-118.

--- 2014. "Aristotle's Biology", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

McKirahan, Richard D. 1992. Principles and Proofs: Aristotle's Theory of Demonstrative Science. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

[1]The Bekker line references to both texts have typos that will confuse readers: the first (987b103) should read 987b1-3, and the second (1087b22-30) should read 1078b22-30.

[2] He names these principles NT1 and NT2—"If S doesn't know what Fness is, S cannot know attributes [NT1] or instances [NT2] of Fness".

[3] In introducing his 'three grades' of epistemological involvement, Ferejohn notes in a footnote (24n7) that it is only in the Theaetetus that Plato rises to Grade 3 epistemology -- it is, he says, an "ancient prototype of epistemology in its present form" on the grounds that it provides a comparative assessment of competing analyses of knowledge. Since Aristotle clearly is engaged in a Grade 3 project (98), it is disappointing that there is no discussion of how the Theaetetus and Analytics match up as "ancient prototypes" of current epistemology.

[4] Referred to as A-explanations in Lennox 1987 and 'application explanations' McKirahan 1991.

[5] For a reasonably complete bibliography of this literature, see the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry on "Aristotle's Biology" (Lennox 2014).

[6] As Marko Malink reminded me, the definition of 'premise' in I.2 is borrowed from APr. I.1, and the discussion of circular proof in I.3 relies on the technical details of APr. II.5.

[7] ‘Epistemic primacy’ is supposed to capture the three conditions on how the premises of a demonstration are related to its conclusion: better known than, prior to, and causative of. Ferejohn variously says these are three ways of looking at the concept of explanation (78), that they are various ways of expressing a single objective condition (79), and that they are ‘equivalent’ (79).