Foucault and Power: The Influence of Political Engagement on Theories of Power

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Marcelo Hoffman, Foucault and Power: The Influence of Political Engagement on Theories of Power, Bloomsbury, 2014, 221pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441180940.

Reviewed by A. Janae Sholtz, Alvernia University


Marcelo Hoffman offers a genetic account of Foucault's notion of power. Thus, the book is organized according to the chronological progression of Foucualt's philosophy. Hoffman maps the intersections of different concepts relating to and informing the progression of Foucault's views on power. This conceptual diagram is matched by the commensurate account of Foucault's political practices. The book contains five chapters, each of which extends the discussion of Foucault's struggle to clarify and enumerate the indices and modalities of power, a concluding chapter, and an appendix containing a never before translated report on prison conditions generated by Information Group on Prisons (GIP) and edited by Foucault. Simultaneously the book's merit and challenge, Hoffman's analysis presents an intricately woven assemblage of the overlappings, twists, and mutations of Foucault's theories of power, one that does justice to Foucault's labyrinthine, non-reductive analyses. In terms of style and clarity, the reader may risk losing sight of Hoffman's thesis amid the details with which he is assailed. Hoffman's prose is filled with equivocations, which, though perhaps intended as nuance, often come across as vacillating and ambiguous.

Hoffman makes several signature claims. As his central thesis, he proposes the relationship between Foucault's political and militant activities and his analysis of power as a dialectic interplay, which provides a more refined and discriminate view of the various permutations of power throughout the development of Foucault's philosophy. The book consists of a detailed examination of the different models of power identified by Foucault (war and governmental) and an analysis of the interrelations between the different modalities of power (disciplinary, biopolitical and governmental) as they relate to specific instances of activism and desire for militant intervention. Hoffman clearly challenges readings of Foucault that demarcate his thinking according to the break with one theory of power in lieu of another. Hoffman conducts a nuanced and precise study of how subsequent iterations of power bear the residuals of predecessor accounts or are informed by them in significant ways. Thus he proposes a continuum where conceptions of power bleed into one another rather than operate as discontinuous breaks.

In the context of developing his thesis, Hoffman pursues the claim that a bellicose understanding of power relations is central to Foucault's early analyses yet also remains minimally operative within his successive accounts. Hoffman's analysis leads him to claim the unwaning centrality of power to Foucault's thought, even in his latter works, which often have been interpreted as Foucault's abandonment or move beyond the elaboration of the techniques of power in light of concern for the more individualized practices of self. Hoffman claims, rather, that Foucault enfolds parrhesia back into the analysis of the matrix of power. Hoffman claims repeatedly that very few have attempted to tease out or elucidate the relationship between his political practices and theoretical development. I am not sure that this is true, at least in the case of the GIP, where there has been much attention drawn to the way that his experiences have resulted in well-established lenses for critique, such as the concept of intolerability and the problem of speaking for others.

Hoffman focuses on three periods of political activism, beginning in the early 1970's: (1) the Prison Information Group (GIP); (2) the Iranian revolution; and (3) the Polish Solidarity movement. With regard to the GIP, the prisoner support movement, Hoffman claims that these experiences were crucial in the development and metamorphosis of Foucault's understanding of disciplinary power. He links Foucault's involvement and interest in the Iranian revolution to his theoretical distinction between a population and a people, and argues that Foucault's fascination with the revolution rests largely in the real manifestation, rather than in theoretical abstraction, of a collective will. Simultaneously, Hoffman's analysis disrupts traditional interpretations of Foucault's interlude with the Iranian revolution that suggest that what is at stake for Foucault is the triumph of traditionalism over modernism. Likewise, his reading of Foucault's involvement in the Polish solidarity movement disputes the assumptions of quietism that many have made concerning Foucault's late turn to governmentality and parrhesia and also resists the portrayal of a dystopian Foucault who sees no political alternatives to the crushing devices of power. By contrast, Hoffman insists that Foucault offers an alternative to disciplinary power in the form of specific life practices. He draws a connection between Foucault's 'militant' activities concerning solidarity efforts in Poland and his immediately following theoretical focus on parrhesia, highlighting Cynic parrhesia in particular as an example of political resistance.

One of the book's merits is that Hoffman presents Foucault's philosophy within the comprehensive schema of his theoretical writings as well as his other activities, biographies, and correspondence. Hoffman provides ample references to the available literature surrounding Foucault's thought, skillfully utilizing it to delineate his own position. In the first chapter, Hoffman declares his intent to utilize Foucault's Collège de France courses, both published and unpublished, to answer questions about the trajectory of his thinking about power. What sets his work apart from other attempts to do the same is the exploration of the conjunction of Foucault's political activities with the development of his thinking. Hoffman provides a brief outline of Foucault's militant involvements and proposes to fill a lacuna in Foucault scholarship by giving equal consideration to all of these activities. The stronger claim that he makes is that it is practically impossible to ascertain a comprehensive understanding of Foucault's development of the concept of power without addressing his political practices (7). He also proposes that Foucault's theoretical trajectory also yield effects in his political engagements, establishing the dialectical framework within which Hoffman will conduct all of his subsequent analysis.

In the second chapter, Hoffman outlines Foucault's involvement in the GIP, positing a direct link to his theories of disciplinary power and the constitution of disciplinary individuality. He strengthens his position by offering several direct quotes in which Foucault implies receiving a kind of 'theoretical education' from the GIP (16-17). Hoffman first develops the notion of a dialectical relationship between Foucault's theory and activism in terms of these interactions, arguing that the collective struggles of the prisoner support movement helped frame Discipline and Punish and that, likewise, this book speaks back to these very prisoners by enumerating obstacles to their ongoing struggles. Hoffman claims that this dialectic is crucial for understanding the centrality of resistance to Foucault's analysis of disciplinary power. He outlines Foucault's commitment to intensifying intolerance to the prison system, accomplished by making public the conditions of the prisoners through the dissemination of information, namely the firsthand accounts, mediated through the GIP, of the prisoners themselves. Hoffman reads Foucault's theoretical output immediately following the dissolution of the GIP as a response to this enterprise of problematization and questioning of the practices, rules, and institutions. The Punitive Society (1972-3) was the occasion for Foucault's consideration of the strange status of the prison system and its purpose within the broader economy of power.

This position is reiterated in Discipline and Punish, where, through a historical lens, Foucault posits the prison institution as a piece of the larger economy of disciplinary power whose purpose is to produce docile and useful subjects. Hoffman explains that the dual aims of docility and utility constitute a contradiction; the investment in the skills and aptitudes of a body that increases utility also provides possible sources of resistance (27). According to Foucault, the techniques of power attempt to resolve this dilemma through control of the body and the production cellular individuality. Hoffman claims that the techniques of power Foucault identifies -- hierarchical observation, normalizing judgment, and examination -- are commensurate to self-described treatment of prisoners. Essentially, the experiences of the prisoners represented a theoretical lesson, wherein Foucault recognized the disciplinary and constituting nature of surveillance, self-monitoring, and the breakup of collective activity. In turn, these theoretical insights needed to be reapplied to the economy of the prison in order for it to be recognized and effectively critiqued; hence, the dialectical relation.

In the third chapter, Hoffman traces the developments and changes in Foucault's understanding of power from the early 1970's through the early 1980's, supplying an overview of the broad framework underpinning his account of disciplinary power. Hoffman explains that Foucault's early account of disciplinary power relies upon a war model concept of power, in which power consists of a set of dominance relations between forces. Hoffman makes two claims. First, he explains Foucault's motivation for deploying this model as a result of his particular political engagements, proposing that, during this period of the GIP, Foucault lived struggle at the same time he posited power as struggle between forces. Second, where many interpreters have assumed that Foucault's scrutiny of this model in Society Must Be Defended reflects Foucault's motivation for abandoning the war model in favor of governmentality, Hoffman argues that traces of the war model can be found in Foucault through the early 1980's, noting that he returns to this model in his analyses of the Iranian revolution. Though Hoffman acknowledges Foucault's genealogy of its emergence in discourses of race war and state racism as a critical turn away from this model, he also suggests that Foucault still understands the war model as necessary to address situations of dominance. This chapter is devoted primarily to explicating Foucault's theoretical position, and, as such, the thesis concerning the necessity of examining Foucault in light of his political activism does not appear as strongly, receding behind the details of this chapter.

In Chapter 4, Hoffman critically engages the concept of population that underpins biopolitics. He explains that the concept of population undergoes major shifts, eventually leading to a rupture with biopolitics, claiming that the biopolitical understanding of population as a mere object of regulations was untenable for Foucault. According to Hoffman, Foucault revises his understanding of population to include a subject dimension, and this theoretical shift is illuminative of his engagement with the Iranian Revolution. Foucault's enthusiasm can be explained in terms of his recognition of the powerful force of a collective will, which animated this revolution. This instantiation of a people through a collective will represented a literal example of the move from his early conception of population to one capable of and animated by agency. Hoffman is careful to acknowledge the precarious nature of advocating for the collective will of the Iranian people, insisting that it was the moment of revolution itself that captivated Foucault, not its aftermath. This, as well, becomes a lesson that Hoffman sees as folded back into Foucault's theorizing, as population as subject-object is not a failsafe against the return of oppressive power. Hoffman's account of Foucault's engagement represents a more balanced approach than many existing accounts, due in large part to his development of Foucault's positive account of political spirituality.

In the fifth chapter, Hoffman couples Foucault's focus on Greco-Roman antiquity and the practice of parrhesia with his political involvement in the Polish Solidarity movement. By emphasizing this connection, Hoffman reads the political back into what many have taken to be Foucault's shift towards ethical, as well as political, placidity or quietism. He argues that, rather than retreating from the political sphere after the tragic events of the Iranian revolution, Foucault actually threw himself back into militant political activities primarily in the form of robust and stringent critique of the French government for its policy of non-interference during the Polish Solidarity trade union movement of 1981, a crucial movement that helped to eventuate the fall of the Soviet Union and loosen the communist hold on Poland. Hoffman's reading of these events against the backdrop of parrhesia as truth-telling requiring both risk and courage is thought provoking. Essentially, he understands Foucault's confrontation with the French government as a parrhesiastic scene.

Yet, as Torben Bech Dyrberg (Foucault on the Politics of Parrhesia, Palgrave Pivot, 2014) observes in another recently published work that draws together Foucault's concerns for power, the search for an alternative politics, and parrhesia, parrhesia pertains to dual aspects of political power and critique. There is a need both to speak truth to power and for power to speak truth as to what must be done, leaving us to question Hoffman's labeling of Foucault's experience as truly parrhesiatic. Parrhesia is the grounds for political authority, which is only possible when both citizen and government are involved and both speak to truth. Can the government be considered a parrhesiatic partner, as Foucault has theoretically conceived? There is also the issue of risk. Hoffman describes a mild form of censorship by the government, but this seems not to approach Foucault's description of the extent of the risk necessary to constitute the courage of parrhesia. Hoffman seems to acknowledge this by the several qualifications he makes to the kind of risk and jeopardy Foucault experiences (134).

Hoffman makes a stronger case for the idea that Foucault's turn to parrhesia is entirely of a piece with his concerns over power. In that a politics of truth-telling provides an alternative to oppositional politics, which would rely upon disciplinary forms of power and control, parrhesiatic life, of the Cynic in particular, provides a model of citizenship at odds with the disciplined subject, thus calling forth a new kind of practice and politics (136), which calls upon a practice of shameless life, intolerable insolence in the face of disciplinary standards and institutions. Hoffman is less clear as to the take away for contemporary politics, though this is in part due to the schematic nature of Foucault's address of the subject, ending with the modest claim that Foucault's interlude with Cynic life suggests that there are certain resources for the subversion of disciplinary subjectivity within our present condition that harken back to this inheritance of political militancy (143).