Four-Dimensionalism: an Ontology of Persistence and Time

Placeholder book cover

Sider, Theodore, Four-Dimensionalism: an Ontology of Persistence and Time, Oxford University Press, 2001, xxiv+255pp, $45 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-92-4443-X.

Reviewed by Hud Hudson, Western Washington University


This is simply a superb book in metaphysics – handsomely written, cleverly argued, and exceedingly clear.

A number of philosophical questions about ontology, mereology, vagueness, identity, persistence, modality, space, and time (and also about the relation of these issues to modern science) have been center stage for the last few decades in the literature in contemporary analytic metaphysics. In Four-Dimensionalism, Ted Sider presents an accessible but rigorous, highly original, and admirably fair discussion of several of these questions as they relate to the popular debate concerning the thesis associated with the title of the book – informally, the thesis that objects have temporal parts.

Although one occasionally skims the introduction to a book, Sider’s intriguing series of opening remarks on methodology and on the relation of the best-candidate theory of meaning to the increasingly popular dispute over whether there could be different semantic values for the unrestricted existential quantifier are worth pausing over. The text proper is divided into (i) a sustained argument against the doctrine of presentism, thus clearing the way for eternalism which then serves as a backdrop for the rest of the book [chapter 2]; (ii) a careful formulation of and introduction to our competitors – Three-Dimensionalism and Four-Dimensionalism [chapters 1 and 3]; (iii) a critical evaluation of the case for Four-Dimensionalism [chapters 4 and 5], and (iv) a critical evaluation of the case against Four-Dimensionalism [chapter 6]. I will begin with an overview of the highlights of Sider’s approach to these four tasks, and I will close by offering some critical remarks on a discussion which I take to be among the most original and exciting features of this work, namely, Sider’s temporal counterpart theory and his counterpart-theoretic treatment of de re temporal predication.

Sider’s excursion into the philosophy of time provides a straightforward introduction to two competing theories: presentism (i.e., roughly, the view that only present objects exist) and eternalism (i.e., roughly, the view that some non-present objects exist – past and future ones). This chapter is notable for its clear and compelling presentation of two widely-recognized difficulties for presentism, namely, “the truth-maker objection” – that presentists are unable to ground the truth of sentences such as ‘it was the case that there exist some dinosaurs’, and “the objection from special relativity” – that to its discredit, presentism is inconsistent with non-revisionary interpretations of well-established scientific views. For the record, the presentists I know best are perfectly willing to take seriously the suggestion that we revise science on the basis of a priori reflection on the nature of time. Such presentists should take heart for they will find something congenial in this chapter aimed against them; for although Sider is clearly less than optimistic about the wisdom of this course of action, he does offer descriptive advice about how such revisions might be constructed. Finally, Sider also introduces what I believe is an entirely original challenge to this theory of time, namely, that presentists are unable to account for the truth of what appear to be uncontroversial claims about cross-time spatial relations.

A common complaint against proponents of temporal parts has been that despite their reciting various suggestive phrases such as ‘objects are spread out in time’ and notwithstanding their employing vivid metaphors like ‘spacetime worm’, when it comes right down to it they have no intelligible thesis to assign to the name ‘Four-Dimensionalism’, and no one really understands what these so-called ‘temporal parts’ are supposed to be. It should, then, be particularly satisfying to the friends of temporal parts that Sider not only rigorously formulates a version of Four-Dimensionalism (and a definition of ‘temporal part’) that should be perfectly intelligible to the Three-Dimensionalist, but he also turns the tables on his opponent by casting doubts on the sense of the Three-Dimensionalist’s slogan “objects are wholly present at each of the times at which they exist,” by showing that the most natural and appealing analyses of ‘being wholly present’ either threaten to reduce the opposition’s view to triviality or else introduce rather unwelcome consequences into the opposition’s theory of persistence over time.

The heart of this book, however, is found in Sider’s critical evaluation of the cases for and against Four-Dimensionalism. He honestly acknowledges that his is a defense by elimination and that his guided tour through the catalog of arguments for and against the thesis in question is designed to show that, on balance, Four-Dimensionalism is the most palatable (or least objectionable) of the views on offer. Among the objections serious (or at least popular) enough to require a response, Sider includes (i) the charge that Four-Dimensionalism cannot supply an acceptable theory of change (to which he provides a modest response invoking the best-candidate theory of meaning, the details of which were sketched in the introductory remarks to the book); (ii) the cluster of criticisms which might plausibly be lurking behind Judith Jarvis Thomson’s pejorative label ‘a crazy metaphysic’ (which he first disentangles and then subjects to a version of the ‘either not crazy at all or else no crazier than its rivals’ defense); (iii) the widely-regarded-as-absolutely-devastating criticism that to its detriment, Four-Dimensionalism must consort with counterpart theory (in response to which he cheerfully appeals to a line of argument that surfaces earlier in the book for the conclusion that this partnership is not only acceptable, it is thoroughly desirable); and (iv) the complaint that the Four-Dimensionalist does not have the resources to draw distinctions we should be able to make involving motion in homogeneous substances (to which he surveys a series of responses finally opting for a promising resolution of his own which builds on a foundation supplied by David Lewis’s best-system theory of laws).

So what does Sider have to say in favor of Four-Dimensionalism? What tips the balance in favor of temporal parts? The primary answers are that Four-Dimensionalism is supported by a compelling argument from vagueness and that it provides the best unified resolution to the various “paradoxes of coincidence.” Before detailing these virtues, however, Sider surveys the secondary support for his case by commenting on a series of alleged defenses of Four-Dimensionalism (which he takes up in order of increasing-plausibility-to-him). These “lesser defenses” include (i) an admittedly unsuccessful Russellian argument from parsimony; (ii) an admittedly unsuccessful Quinean argument from tense and logic; (iii) an admittedly unsuccessful argument from the incoherence of the A-theory of time; (iv) a suggestive but inconclusive argument from special relativity; (v) a suggestive but inconclusive argument from the analogy of space and time; (vi) a considerably more popular (but here somewhat deflated) argument from temporary intrinsics; (vii) two truly entertaining, speculative, original, (and non-decisive) “arguments from exotica” concerning timeless worlds and time travel; (viii) two arguments from spacetime – the first (and stronger, I think) aimed at those who accept substantivalism, and the second aimed at those who favor relationalism; and lastly, (ix) an ingenious argument from vagueness which mirrors (after first improving upon) David Lewis’s famous argument from vagueness for a principle of unrestricted composition. (This particular defense, I should note, is really quite powerful and well presented – a genuine highlight of the book.)

Even if all of the arguments from the preceding paragraphs were forfeited, however, Sider would still be willing to make the case for Four-Dimensionalism on the sole ground that it furnishes the best unified resolution to the various “paradoxes of coincidence” (i.e., to the sort of puzzle that pressures us to adopt the thesis – unacceptable to many – that there are perfectly co-located material objects (e.g., a statue and its constituting lump of clay, or perhaps a cat and one its proper parts after an accident leaves it tailless)). Here I am convinced. I concede that this is the finest of the reasons to count oneself a Four-Dimensionalist, and I think Sider has done a terrific and compelling job of saying what can be said on this score. In fact, one really outstanding feature of this book is just how concise and clear Sider manages to be when covering so much contemporary literature on this topic. There are, of course, other reactions to the paradoxes of coincidence, each with its own very able defenders – including those who deny the existence of material composites altogether, those who deny the doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts, those who adopt mereological essentialism, those who depend upon and exploit a sortal-essentialism principle, those who recognize a relation of temporary identity that does not bind numerical identity, and even those who are happy to acknowledge the co-location of distinct material objects and see nothing worth apologizing for in these puzzles. Sider does not exaggerate the shortcomings of these alternative resolutions, but he does plainly expose them – and in my view successfully shows why Four-Dimensionalism is the most plausible lesson to extract from investigation of these puzzles.

Here, though, we part company (as I predict will most of his audience – even those who are as thoroughly sympathetic to Four-Dimensionalism as I am), for in addition to mounting his book-length defense of what we may call ‘the orthodox view’ of Four-Dimensionalism, Sider is also prepared to back a variant which he calls ‘the stage view’, and which he argues has further virtues that make it even more attractive than its better-known cousin.

Given a principle of unrestricted composition and the doctrine of arbitrary undetached parts, the orthodox view and the stage view will share an ontology. The difference between these two versions of Four-Dimensionalism comes in identifying just which objects in this common ontology are the ones we typically name, refer to, and quantify over. Which, for example, are the persons? Whereas the proponent of the orthodox view takes such objects to be spacetime worms (i.e., objects with non-zero temporal extent), the proponent of the stage view surprises us with the verdict that they are instead instantaneous entities or stages (i.e., objects with temporal location but without temporal extent). In other words, a Sider-person is just an orthodox Four-Dimensionalist’s instantaneous person-stage.

The chief virtue leading Sider to award the stage view higher marks than the orthodox view has to do with intuitions about counting and how best to square those intuitions with puzzles pressuring us to count objects (say, the Fs) by relations other than identity or else to secure an acceptable count of the Fs only by counting things other than the Fs. The stage view, it turns out, solves these puzzles by letting us attend to the Fs themselves, count by identity, and get what appears to be the proper answer. Admittedly, the stage view gets other cases (involving timeless counting) wrong, for ‘there are fewer persons than moments of time’ comes out false! But – that point aside – the stage view has pretty good credentials when it comes to the criterion of success-at-counting-puzzles. And that, we can admit, is a mark in its favor.

What are the costs? One (bad) objection: “If I am a moment-bound individual, then I have no de re temporal properties of the form ‘I was/will be F’; but I do. So, I’m not.” Recall a misguided complaint against modal counterpart theory: “If I am a world-bound individual, then I have no de re modal properties of the form ‘I could have been F’; but I do. So, I’m not.” Just as the modal counterpart theorist responds to this complaint with his own analysis of de re modal predication, Sider provides (and very competently explains) a version of temporal counterpart theory together with an analysis of de re temporal predication. The short version of the story is this: although I am an instantaneous thing, I nevertheless have de re temporal properties of the form ‘I was/will be F’. The truth condition for an utterance of the form ‘I was/will be F’ is ‘there is an object, x, such that (i) x exists before/after the time of the utterance, (ii) x is F, and (iii) I have x as a temporal (person-)counterpart’. Moreover, the orthodox Four-Dimensionalist may understand ‘x is a temporal (person-)counterpart of y’ to signal the very relation he had in mind when invoking the phrase ‘momentary person-stage x is a stage of the same person as momentary person-stage y’; in other words, the stage view’s temporal (person-)counterpart relation can simply be read off of the orthodox view’s gen-identity relation for person-stages.

A (slightly better) objection: “Claims about features of past and future persons numerically distinct from me are simply not at all relevant to assignments of de re temporal properties to me. But this is precisely what temporal counterpart theory endorses. So, so much the worse for it.” This is a complaint about the proffered analysis and is a dialectically appropriate challenge, for unlike the previous objection it does not try to raise a problem for the view under fire by employing some other analysis expressly denied by its champions. Sider should (and does) say that we may well have grounds for this claim of irrelevance, but (after all) he has grounds for preferring the stage view, and now it’s a contest. However, even after acknowledging that my intuitions about theoretical analyses don’t have trump-card status in this debate, I still take them to outweigh the counting advantages of the stage view. Sider disagrees.

A (rather better) objection: “Temporal counterpart theory is wrong, for it will misclassify the following necessary falsehoods as possible truths: (i) I will be such that I once was you. (ii) Whereas it is not true that I will see the year 2065, I will be such that I will see the year 2065. (iii) Although my current action is morally wrong, never fear – for I will be such that I never performed it.” Clarifications: Since the temporal counterpart relation fails to be transitive, if I have a future-oriented counterpart who has you as a past-oriented counterpart (e.g., as is the case in familiar fusion scenarios), then (i) will be counted true; alternatively, in post-fission cases, the equally unpalatable ‘I once was such that I will be you’ comes out true. Similarly, since (in a familiar longevity scenario) I might currently have a pre-2065, future-oriented counterpart whose 2065 future-oriented counterpart is no future-oriented counterpart of mine, (ii) will come out true. Finally, suppose (as is the case with its modal analogue) the temporal counterpart relation also fails to be symmetric. (Note: conceding this feature of the relation would prohibit unqualifiedly identifying it with the orthodox view’s gen-identity relation for person-stages.) Then (on the assumption that I am currently misbehaving in some manner) if I have a future-oriented counterpart who does not have me as a past-oriented counterpart, (iii) will come out true, as well. These are significant costs. I take them to outweigh the advantages of the stage view.

Of course, we might observe that the stage view can boast a few other advantages over the orthodox view as well, including being better supported by the argument from temporary intrinsics and being immune to the modal argument designed to force a union between the orthodox view and counterpart theory. But to those who don’t put much weight on the argument from temporary intrinsics and who have no complaint against counterpart theory to begin with, these advantages may not be worth the costs that the proponents of the stage view will have to be prepared to pay.

At the end of the day, however – whether or not Sider entices some subset of his converts to Four-Dimensionalism to also embrace the stage view – I think we may confidently judge that he has contributed a genuinely challenging and philosophically satisfying book to the literature in contemporary metaphysics.