Franz Rosenzweig and the Systematic Task of Philosophy

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Benjamin Pollock, Franz Rosenzweig and the Systematic Task of Philosophy, Cambridge UP, 2009, 338pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521517096.

Reviewed by Hartwig Wiedebach, University of Zurich


 In 1921, Franz Rosenzweig (1886-1929) published his philosophical-theological opus magnum: Der Stern der Erlösung (The Star of Redemption, SE), in the Kauffmann-Verlag in Frankfurt, a renowned publishing house for Jewish studies.1 The book had a mixed reception, marked by both interest and puzzlement. Consequently, four years later, Rosenzweig published “additional remarks” regarding the book. He explained that SE was not a Jewish book in the common understanding of the term. Almost provocatively, Rosenzweig wrote: "rather it is merely a system of philosophy".2 Benjamin Pollock’s book is the most extensive and detailed study to date on this assertion. It presents all the earlier stages in Rosenzweig’s thought that led to this conception, and then discusses the systematic construction of SE itself. The presentation is clear and understandable (and particularly accessible because of its wise use of cross-references and frequent restatements of the main theses).

Pollock documents in a highly illuminating manner the extensive dispute Rosenzweig waged with Kant, with the tradition of German idealism nourished by Spinoza and Jacobi’s counter-criticism, and with a number of contemporary comrades in thought and friends in his own circle. That is manifest, for example, in looking at the question of what actually motivated Rosenzweig to engage in constructing a system. Pollock discovers this motivation in Rosenzweig’s well-known early works.

In 1912, Rosenzweig wrote his dissertation, which was published eight years later as Hegel und der Staat. In 1914, he published the text and his own commentary on a previously unknown manuscript written by Hegel that Rosenzweig called Das älteste Systemprogramm des Deutschen Idealismus, attributing it to Schelling. Especially in Rosenzweig’s commentary on the Systemprogramm, Pollock unearths the motives for a very individual perspective, significantly different from the idealists, in which Rosenzweig would conceptualize the fundamental problem of any philosophical system: the problem of “the unity of the One and All, of identity and difference” (p. 23).

Kant was the thinker who placed the idea of system on philosophy’s agenda, although Rosenzweig thought it had always lain like an embryo waiting in the womb of philosophical rumination. Hegel and Schelling seized on this in particular, and formulated their systems as responses to the new challenge. A century later, however, the landscape of philosophical questioning had substantially changed: how to view the question of system seemed in a precarious situation that is ultimately unsatisfactory.

Is the ‘system’ still an option for thinking the Whole or, to put it in Hegel’s famous phrasing, to grasp one’s own time in thought? In philosophy, the form of system has pretty much faded from general debate since the flowering of neo-Kantianism in the first third of the 20th century. Among the tendencies running counter to such attempts are the huge material and methodological differentiation of the various sciences, the obligation sensed everywhere in the West to remain ‘open’ and receptive to other cultures, and the numerous efforts to construct a hermeneutics of historical-biographical phenomena, extending all the way to a philosophy of everyday life.

Over against this decline in system thinking in philosophy there looms a veritable boom in building systems in other spheres. Today we seem to encounter concepts of system wherever the description and theory of certain sub-spheres of the world, life or human existence are concerned: in cosmology, ecology, economy, biology, sociology or psychology. However, the systems theories in biology, sociology or the information sciences, for example, do not regard themselves as direct descendants of those older efforts in philosophy to contemplate the “unity of the One and All” in the framework of a system. The anarchic element inherent in these tendencies, and more generally the consciousness of the fragmentary nature of everything that can be done and achieved, would appear, at least in the realm of philosophy, to be in direct opposition to the form of thought of a grand system. If nonetheless one wishes to preserve rather than jettison the question of the Whole and the ‘universe’, the “All”, as a motif in philosophical questioning, then despite those objections, the figure of a system must be critically examined anew, perhaps in a way still seldom applied. That is the basic question with which Pollock confronts and interrogates Rosenzweig’s work.

Rosenzweig formulated a system that does not deny those anarchic elements. On the contrary, it draws its sustenance from them. With his system, Rosenzweig wishes to lead us on to the threshold of everyday thought in its concrete simplicity. But more than just discursive thought is important here. The concrete experience of what is thought plays its decisive role in life with the same weight (cf. Pollock, pp. 235-257). Thus, as Pollock convincingly describes it, Rosenzweig’s “system of philosophy” also assumes a figure, and can be experienced in all its stages in that Denkfigur. In its graphic character as ‘figure of thought’, the “star of redemption” becomes a motor for construction of a system, from the building blocks of its structure down to its finished final form.

Three fundamental realities that have stamped Western thought since classical antiquity shape the initial approach: God, the world and man. In Part I of SE, Rosenzweig places them unconnected in separate spheres of Being one next to the other: on one side, the multiplicity of the classical world of the Gods; alongside man, silenced in tragic conflict; and next to these the cosmos, ahistorical, shaping and reshaping itself. In Jewish-Christian revelation, a system of linking events overlays this “pagan” trinity: the experience and implementation of divine creature are contained in knowing the world. The experience of revelation is wrapped in the erotic experience of the moment of love. And we discern a prolepsis of future redemption in the active fulfilment of the demands of what and who is nearest to an individual. These acts of implementing and consummation, according to Rosenzweig/Pollock, constitute the dual threefold structural figure: on one side, the three fundamental elements, on the other, their three modes of linkage.

This duplex trinity, in the shape of two overlaid triangles, forms the Jewish Star of David. The aim is to ‘think the Whole’ and to let it become a figure in a manner directly open to experience. Initially, in the religious liturgies of Judaism and Christianity, but ultimately in a vision of mystical unity overarching these two traditions, the “All” itself is experienced, and with it the unlimited multiplicity of human and worldly things. With Elliot Wolfson, Pollock ascribes this vision of unity to a ‘phenomenological’ type of mysticism in the Western tradition (p. 276). Pollock intimates that Rosenzweig ultimately could only claim this for himself, i.e. for his own person (pp. 301, 304). Yet it remains an open question whether this peak experience, a “vision beyond life”, can still be termed ‘philosophical’ (p. 283).

Such an approach to system and its building stands as a provocation for all previous academic philosophy. The undistorted facticity of the anarchic and threatening element must be endured. At the center lies the human being, whose anchorage lies not in the discursive interconnection of ideas but, on the contrary, in the fear of death, which is manifest every day, even if it is often suppressed.3 The pervasive indicator is not to deny this anxiety but to hold on tight to it. The system of a vademecum for life is to be drawn from the knowledge concerning the innumerable small and smallest aspects in which one’s own mortality exercises its power. Along with constructive methodology, his educational principle is a strictly orchestrated total picture of experiences of thought and faith. From the “middle” of life, "in experiencing ourselves as existing parts of the world, as individual free personal selves, called upon to act in the world, we experience system" (p. 238).

Yet precisely this justified emphasis on thoughtful experience (denkende Erfahrung) opens up a noticeable gap in Pollock’s exposition. SE consists of three parts. In each, the ways or types in which argument is built differ, and most particularly the type of speech, or discourse. Rosenzweig drafts Part I of SE as a formal language of mathematical structures, remaining to an extent silent, speechless. In Part II we deal with articulated language, real spoken discourse. The experience of the world as creation guides the “language of perception and knowledge”, the experience of the moment as revelation is heard in the “language of love”, and the experience of the future forces the human being to a pragmatic “language of the deed”. In Part III, a language of gestures appears through religious services, in the linguistic-bodily immediacy of liturgy. Precisely in relation to the peak experience of the “All” in counterplay with the “singularities” it contains, this language of gesture has something more essential to “say”, something different from everything uttered by human tongue.

Rosenzweig’s “system of philosophy” hovers solely in the harmony of these very different languages invoked by the Star of Redemption. As Pollock states, there is no architectonic or dialectical logicality that bridges from one part to the next (p. 74, for example). For the “transition” from Part I to Part II, the “possibility of experiencing the miracle” is necessary, and over the “threshold” between Part II to Part III leads the “possibility of entreating the (messianic) kingdom”. Clear here is the intimate relation between philosophy and religious experience. Philosophizing in the form of a system means traversing a path leading through several metamorphoses of speech. Pollock does not deal with these metamorphoses. Naturally he is quite aware of that, postponing this desideratum to future inquiry (pp. 212, 256, 314). Yet precisely to examine and explain this special “system of philosophy” requires a philosophy of speech and speaking as an integral element. It is not some sort of condiment one can reserve to grace later explanations.

I will mention only one of the important sources for this. In 1916, Rosenzweig’s friend Eugen Rosenstock formulated a theory of speech that had substantial influence on Rosenzweig’s “system”.4 By the act of articulation, and by what he articulates, the human being creatively shapes reality. In Rosenstock’s view, he thus places himself at the centre of a cross whose beams correspond to two fundamental dimensions, space and time. Both dimensions in turn form one pair of correlating vectors: interior and exterior (space), past and future (time). In space, an internal will to express oneself stands over against the force of external influences; on the plane of time, there is the closed linguistic heritage of the past and the open linguistic creation of the future. Four ways of speaking correspond to this: the languages of art, law, science and religion. In these, human beings relate to other humans, to the world, and ultimately to God. Rosenzweig does not adopt this metaphorics of the spatial-temporal cross, but he finds in the figure of the star his own distinctive metaphor, in which key aspects of Rosenstock’s performative language theory, especially the axis of temporal polarity, are clearly manifest.

Pollock’s book does not end with a ready solution for the reader. He does not provide an answer to the question whether a new philosophizing in the form of a system, based on Rosenzweig, is possible and can be meaningful. After all, one could also call what Pollock presents as Rosenzweig’s “system of philosophy” — viewed in terms of its anarchic aspects of multiplicity, actuality, contingency and fragmentariness — an ‘anti-system’. One has an impression of ambivalence that springs from the fact that Rosenzweig was able to imbue this very ‘anti-system’ with a quite strict and systematic form. The systems of philosophy of German idealism from the past, but also the designs created in his own time, especially by neo-Kantianism (for example, Hermann Cohen and Heinrich Rickert), pursue very different paths, at least at first glance.

Nonetheless, in the philosophical tradition, there were also important alternatives that anticipated some of Rosenzweig’s intentions, such as the French encyclopaedists or several of the writers in German Romanticism. There is need for further research that would trace and describe each of these paths in their own right and also compare them to Rosenzweig’s approach. Among the French encyclopaedists, there was the attempt to project the figure of thought of the system directly in an explicitly lexically ordered multiplicity of things and situations (d’Alembert, Diderot). Among the Romantics, a central concern was to derive nonetheless a system of a vision of totality from a fundamental experience of the world and life grounded on the fragmentary (Novalis, Friedrich Schlegel). Finally, during Rosenzweig’s own time, there were conceptions of system such as the philosophy of nature of Rosenzweig’s friend and medical anthropologist, Viktor von Weizsäcker (cf. pp. 86-91).

All these examples point to the fact that Pollock’s study can also provide stimuli for other fields. Precisely when it comes to encyclopaedic or medical systematicity, Pollock’s central thesis that a “system of philosophy” in Rosenzweig’s sense must not only be thought but also experienced is intriguing. Whether that is possible is decided not only by the coherence of an author of a system in terms of its exposition and conceptions. Its possibility is also determined by the success or failure of an attitude toward the realities of everyday life and death acquired through experience along its way.

This review was translated from the German by Bill Templer, University of Malaya.

1 Translated twice into English: The Star of Redemption, tr. William Hallo. New York: Holt, Rinehart, & Winston 1971; The Star of Redemption, tr. Barbara E. Galli. Madison: U of Wisconsin Press 2005.

2 Franz Rosenzweig: "Das neue Denken. Einige nachträgliche Bemerkungen zum Stern der Erlösung" 1925, English: “The New Thinking” 1925, in: Philosophical and Theological Writings, trs. and eds. Paul W. Franks and Michael L. Morgan. Indianapolis: Hackett 2000, p. 110 (my emphasis).

3 Vgl. in addition to Pollock Heinz-Jürgen Görtz: Tod und Erfahrung. Rosenzweigs “erfahrende Philosophie” und Hegels "Wissenschaft der Erfahrung des Bewusstseins". Düsseldorf: Patmos 1984; and Peter Eli Gordon: Rosenzweig und Heidegger: Between Judaism and German Philosophy. U of California Press 2003.

4 Cf. e.g. Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy: “Angewandte Seelenkunde” [1916/23], in: Die Sprache des Menschengeschlechts. Heidelberg: Lambert Schneider, Vol. 1, 1963, pp. 739-810.