Free Will, Agency, and Selfhood in Indian Philosophy

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Matthew R. Dasti and Edwin F. Bryant (eds.), Free Will, Agency, and Selfhood in Indian Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2014, 312pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199922758.

Reviewed by Christopher Bartley, University of Liverpool


This is a fine collection of learned essays replete with translations from primary sources, but a sense of frustration may be induced in the reader attracted by the book's title. Most of the contributors admit that the topics of free will, agency and selfhood as understood in the West today don't really have equivalents in the Indian traditions of thought and practice under consideration.

Some people are lucky enough to have as much freedom as we really need, while others are victims of forms of psychological, social and political oppression. Free will became a problem in response to certain theories that threaten what Bernard Williams called a deep metaphysical notion of the voluntary: when Lutherans said that the will was in thrall to sin; when the extension of a mechanistic worldview to human lives raised the spectre of the cog in the machine; whenever people were described purely as objects belonging to a natural world and governed even in their choices by its laws. Broadly speaking, as Elisa Freschi observes (p. 140) the contexts to which such ideas belong did not occur in classical India, and there don't seem to be any discussions of the freedom of the will couched in terms that modern Western philosophers would identify with. More controversially, I suggest that what our self-obsessed generation means by 'The Self' was alien to the philosophers discussed in this book. It is true that Brahmins thought up sundry theories about the essential nature (ātman), especially in so far as a true conception of what we really are had a bearing on salvation or freedom from rebirth. But what some thinkers today mean by 'The Self' -- elusive, engaged, conflicted, problematic, or divided -- is not something that preoccupied Indian thinkers (give or take a few egomaniacs who thought that the whole world was their self-expression) perhaps because they did not share our exaggerated anthropocentricity.

It must also be observed that the dualism espoused by most Brahmin thinkers makes Descartes look like a gifted amateur. This emerges most clearly in Edwin Bryant's lucid piece of exposition 'Agency in Sāṃkhya and Yoga: The Unchangeability of the Eternal', which describes the aetiology of individual experiencers when the unchanging light of consciousness irradiates mutable minds made of matter. Thinkers belonging to the Sāṃkhya tradition said that souls -- self-aware monads -- neither acted nor had experiences. Had they done so, their essential tranquility would have been disturbed. This was one of the contemplative traditions whose practitioners renounced the world of normal social relations in response to their intuition that we are never really agents. This religion of renunciation also finds expression in Advaita Vedānta, the multiplicity of whose developed forms are ably expounded in Sthaneshwar Timalsina's essay on its original exponent, Śaṃkara (and his contemporaries and successors), who thinks that really there are neither agents nor even individuals. Free will, agency and selfhood are here cases of what is called avidyā or misconception.

George Cardona's valuable 'Pāṇinian Grammarians on Agency and Independence' expounds a feature of the Sanskrit grammatical tradition. What is relevant to nearly everything mentioned in this book is the fact that educated Indians were brought up on Pāṇini's grammar of Sanskrit. When considering the various factors that may be implicit in actions, Pāṇini says that the agent is independent. In other words, if we analyse events into their components, the agent is the only one that is not acted upon by external forces. His decisions are not just the outcome of an already given, and to that extent external, psycho-physical causal chain of events. That he does not create himself does not seem to matter. No one seems to have said that it is not causation but constraint that is inimical to freedom. The agent's privileged status may be assumed to be something that was taken for granted. Moreover, our being bound to a process of rebirth does not appear to have been deemed a threat to freedom. Most people thought that the decision to attempt the journey to liberation from rebirth was freely taken. Whether the individual is free to choose and then to act one way or the other becomes problematic when human and divine agency were envisaged as occupying the same space, as it were.

As Karin Meyer's judicious 'Free Persons, Empty Selves' shows, Buddhist philosophers had no interest in controversies about free will. Buddhists deny that there are any enduring substances and a fortiori any selves worthy of the name. Most of us suppose ourselves to be individual continuants, but this is a misconception perpetuated by conventions of thought and language. No selves, no free will and no real individual agency here, just successive complexes of transient events. Meyer's formulation of a Buddhist version of 'compatibilism' (which Kant called 'a wretched subterfuge', and I call 'the freedom of the free-range chicken') looks promising, but hopes are dashed when one reads that 'it is important to note that this solution is not described in any classical [Buddhist] source' (p. 44). That sad admission is confirmed by Jay Garfield in 'Just Another Word for Nothing Left to Lose: Freedom, Agency and Ethics for Mādhyamikas'. Given that there is no self with a will that might be free or otherwise, it is unsurprising that 'it is impossible to formulate the thesis of the freedom of the will in a Buddhist framework' (p. 175) and only to be expected that recent exponents of Buddhist philosophy have been doing precisely that!

Matthew Dasti's 'Nyāya's Self as Agent and Knower' presents a viewpoint that contrasts strikingly with that of the Sāṃkhyas described by Bryant. While his opening sentence, 'Much of Classical Hindu thought has centered on the question of self ' is open to question (p. 112), it is true that this is what Westerners have thought. More specifically, this absorbing paper actually misses what is distinctive about the Nyāya idea of self: viz., the fact that it is not conscious by nature. These principles of identity become the bearers of mental and affective states only when embodied. Cognition, memory, desires, feelings and intentions are but their temporary contingent properties of a subject. Dasti neatly avoids mention of this unpalatable fact by resisting the temptation to expound the Nyāya view of the non-experiential nature of the released soul. They take consolation from the fact that there is no such thing as blissful consciousness in the state of release because consciousness is always afflicted by fear of its loss. Also, you are better off dead because then you can't want anything. (It should be said that they weren't exactly in the business of soteriology.) When Uddyotakara responds to the Buddhist rejection of persisting subjects of experience with,

since desires (and cognitions and feelings) have the same objects as memory they establish that there is a single agent. This is because there is no synthesis of experiences belonging to different agents, that are about different things, and which are the results of different psychological functions. Hence there must be a subject that is the synthesiser. (p. 117)

he is using a transcendental argument for an enduring unifier of the manifold of experiences, but not for an enduring substantial self replete with experiences that will participate in liberation (p. 135). The embodied subject is an enduring and substantial complex of psychological and physical functions. Its world-directed intentional episode states are purely transparent and do not reveal themselves to their owner but require a second-order illuminator in the form of a distinct mental episode. The agency of the embodied soul does not flow from his essential nature (p. 121), although is it is connected with it. The Nyāya thinkers are not revealing the depths and riches of selfhood; they are constructing bulwarks against the Buddhist rejection of substance. (Incidentally, the word translated on page 122 n.32 as 'overseer' means controller or regulator.)

Freschi reads some Mīmāṃsakas as compatibilists, but this is questionable. Let's uncontroversially take compatibilism to mean that free will is consistent with the causal determination of decisions (and incompatible with constraint and compulsion). A particular choice is determined by and flows from the state of a person's character at a given moment. Given that character, it was inevitable that he should have chosen as he did. But if his character had been different, he would have chosen otherwise. So it is held to be true that he could have chosen otherwise than he did, had his character been different. The problem for Freschi's view is that of finding an argument along these lines in Mīmāṃsā sources. I do not believe that they would have said that the agent could not have acted otherwise than he did. It is true that some ritual theorists say that actions are motivated by desires, but they also say that we are capable of modifying our desires. It follows that while we may be influenced or persuaded by desires, in the final analysis we are independent of and not constituted by the interests, moods and attitudes that make up a character. I think that the invocation of compatibilism would have something to recommend it in a case where someone believed that her present experience is nothing other than the effects of her past actions (karma). There are doubtless people who have thought that one's karma determines every detail of one's present decisions, but the majority view resists such fine-tuning. Rather, karma is responsible for one's overall circumstances expressed in one's family, caste and length of life.

David Peter Lawrence's 'The Linguistics and Cosmology of Agency in Nondual Kashmiri Śaiva Thought' provides an overview of the theistic idealism propounded by Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta, the progenitors of the Pratyabhijñā ('recognition') school. For those thinkers, liberation from rebirth happens for one who re-cognises that he is none other than a divine act of self-expression. When the prima facie limited 'I' realises that its own agency is that of the deity Śiva, the acquired 'Śiva-identity' is a state of empowerment, wherein lies true freedom beyond the trammels of embodiment in a material environment and oppression by human convention. These sophisticated metaphysical theories belong to a religious context according to which human beings are at their most free when possessed or taken over by the divinity. In such circumstances, individual freedom is of little interest. I am unconvinced by Lawrence's claim (p. 218) that the Pratyabhijñā philosophers refute other theories on the basis of their reduction of all causality to the syntax of agency. It is indisputable that these theistic idealists hold that all causality is the preserve of conscious agents, but I'm not clear what it means to say (p. 219) that there is a reduction to the syntax of agency in the framework of an ontology of action (and will). At risk of pedantry, the translation at the top of page 225 should read:

When there is manifestation of knowable objects distinct from the embodied agent whose consciousness is contracted, then there is the taint of karma in the form of dharma and adharma. Thence arise birth and experiences, which mean subjection to external conditions. Thus there arises karma, whose consequences are caste, lifespan and experience of consequences.

Martin Ganeri writes illuminatingly about the theistic Vedānta of Rāmānuja and explains the niceties of the latter's doctrine that genuine agency belongs to souls embodied in the world. There is an exhaustive discussion of the complications raised by Rāmānuja's not infrequent assertions that the deity causes the actions of his devotees. What Rāmānuja probably means is that God supplies the conditions needed for the exercise of free agency but does not make our choices for us. Something unmentioned but perhaps of interest is Rāmānuja's solution of a problem felt acutely by Indian devotional theists: does a divinity active in arranging the dispositions of the world take account of human karma or not? If he does, his freedom is compromised. If he does not, he acts unfairly. Rāmānuja solves this by saying that what are called good and bad karma are in fact expressions of the divine will as rewards or punishment, thereby rejecting the standard view that karma is an automatic mechanism.

What Ganeri, following John Carman and Julius Lipner, identifies as paradoxes or 'polarities' in Rāmānuja's thought may perhaps be explained as what happens when an attempt is made to harmonise a Tantric theistic religion with traditional Vedānta. That is why the characteristics of a personal deity involved in the lives of his worshippers have to be reconciled with a notion of a changeless transcendent reality. Also, the drive to accommodation with the orthodox Vedāntic mainstream encouraged adoption of the view that the soul is not intrinsically an agent when most Tantric traditions hold that the power of action is an essential property.

David Buchta talks about Madhva, another theistic Vedāntin, who places rather more emphasis on the divinity's transcendent independence than do Rāmānuja and his tradition. He espouses the unusual view that souls are inherently and eternal unequal in their moral worth, thus transposing caste hierarchy onto an ultimate plane. Some souls are destined for salvation and others doomed. Such is the will of Viṣṇu, whose partiality to his devotees is taken for granted.

Buchta describes the Mādhva schools influence on the Gauḍīya Vaiṣṇava tradition in Bengal, which forms the topic of Satyanarayana Dasa and Jonathan Edelmann's contribution. The Tantric nature of that devotional tradition finds expression in its doctrine that the soul is always essentially an agent as well as a knower.

This is a collection whose parts inform and support one another. It is genuinely informative and stimulating. The editors have done a good job in drawing all this material together (although something has gone wrong with the Index under the letter P), and Oxford University Press has produced an attractive volume.