Freedom and Reflection: Hegel and the Logic of Age­ncy

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Christopher Yeomans, Freedom and Reflection: Hegel and the Logic of Age­ncy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 275pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199794522.

Reviewed by Michael Quante, Westfälische Wilhelms-Universität Münster


Christopher Yeomans' book is a challenge for the reader in many respects. Intending to provide a study on Hegel and the logic of agency, Yeomans addresses -- at least -- three big topics. He first aims at the heart of Hegel's practical philosophy, which Yeoman rightly identifies as his expressivist and social philosophy of agency. Second, he claims to make explicit Hegel's answer to the classical metaphysical problem of free will, demonstrating that Hegel's conception is a philosophy of freedom. And thirdly, Yeomans intends to demonstrate that both Hegel's philosophy of action and his 'solution' of the free-will problem cannot be made intelligible without taking into account Hegel's Logic (by which Yeomans refers both to the Wissenschaft der Logik and the first part of the Enzyklopedia). In so doing he wants to show that the complex and mostly very abstract reasoning we find in Hegel's Logic can be used to solve specific philosophical problems we deal with today.

To reach these three goals Yeomans not only guides the reader through some of the most difficult passages of Hegel's work but also invokes contemporary debates in the analytic philosophy of free will and Kant's philosophy. One can easily imagine that such a task is not only highly ambitious but that its realization will give many readers a hard time.

Yeomans' book is so complex and the arguments unfolded in its twelve chapters are so sophisticated that every attempt to present them in any detail here would prove unsatisfactory. So I shall restrict myself to some more general comments addressing what I think are the cornerstones of Yeomans' book. The stage setting in its very detailed and complex introduction delivers Yeomans' interpretation of Hegel's stance towards the metaphysical problem of free will and presents Hegel's theory of free will by analyzing the introductory paragraphs of his Philosophy of Right. Having established that giving Hegel an expressivist reading is a fruitful approach, Yeomans' second step consists in demonstrating that the heart of Hegel's expressivism lies in his theory of reflection, which can be found in the opening parts of his Logic of Essence. Here, as I understand Yeomans, we find the basic elements of Hegel's analysis of the conceptual structure that makes action and experience possible although they seem to pull us in different directions -- the former hinting at complete internal determination, the latter at complete external determination. For Hegel, as Yeomans seeks to establish, "reflection and expression, self- and other-relation, and causal exemption are all fundamentally the same conceptual problem" (19); and as I read him Yeomans holds the same thesis (cf. 17, 19, 23 or 25).

Even if he were willing to consider a more context-sensitive way of dealing with the problem, the overall architecture of his book, taking Hegel's Logic as the basic structure, commits Yeomans to this reading (at least if he wants to defend the view that the conception he elaborates as Hegel's is systematically plausible). Moreover he rightly identifies Hegel's conception of autonomy or, as Yeomans puts it, "self-determination" (15), and not the concept of action as developed in the Philosophy of Right, as the conceptual resource for developing a notion of freedom that includes not only an expressive but also a productivist element. This means, as Yeomans correctly makes clear, that we cannot avoid explanatory (or causal) elements in our conceptions of action and freedom. Therefore I am in complete agreement with him that emphasizing the expressivist and social dimension of Hegel's conception of action is not sufficient for bypassing the problem of mental causation (cf. 9).

If one follows Hegel into the abstractions of his Logic, one has to face the danger of reducing specific philosophical problems to a formal conceptual structure in which the original problems get lost. Therefore Yeomans has to show that his interpretation of expression as reflection can "be substantiated by showing first how this structure works itself out in explanation, modality, causation, and teleology; and second how these further conceptual structures are used in Hegel's theory of the will to present the agent as a robust locus of activity and responsibility" (57). This program is spelled out in detail in the three parts of Yeomans' book that follow the first and introductory part. I will not even try to comment on his detailed, mostly illuminating but very complicated explications of Hegel's metaphysical analysis of ground, modalities, causality or teleology.

Yeoman is right in ignoring the conceptual developments Hegel makes explicit to organize his Logic as a process of self-unfolding and self-determination, since the purpose of this interpretation is to show that Hegel's views are helpful (and needed) to fully understand his conception of free agency. Furthermore Yeomans does a very good job in demonstrating that a merely transcendental reading of Hegel's Logic isn't enough to save its conceptual power (although he also shows that such a reading is illuminating in lots of ways). I have to admit that I haven't seen clearly how Yeomans combines Hegel's analysis of the relation between causality and teleology with the classical metaphysical problem of free will. On the one hand, one can hold a deterministic conception of teleology (if one doesn't restrict determinism to efficient causality ruled by strict causal laws) so that there seems to be the option of holding that some conceptions of teleology are incompatible with libertarianism. On the other hand, Yeoman's analysis seems to show that Hegel criticizes and redefines central notions in such a way that the classical notions of determination and modalities are not in play. On this reading one might claim that Hegel is simply not part of the traditional debate concerning free will anymore (I come back to this below).

Hegel scholars may ask whether the relation that Yeomans' strategy presupposes between Hegel's Logic and the other parts of his mature system is compatible with Hegel's own understanding of this relation. However, I think that Yeomans' approach is a fruitful one. It is one of the great achievements of this book to demonstrate the systematic fruitfulness of Hegel's Logic for our contemporary debates. The problems I have had in following the arguments presented in Freedom and Reflection are interconnected and stem from a different source.

The first problem I see is that Yeomans tells two different stories about Hegel's relation to the traditional free will problem. On the one hand, on his reading it seems as if Hegel tries to give an answer within the conceptual space in which this problem is constituted. Read in this way the reader finds (primarily in the first part of the book) puzzling statements saying that Hegel is basically committed to incompatibilist premises (which Yeoman also ascribes to common sense and our daily practice-- a debatable claim), but that he also uses the compatibilist strategy to give a philosophical interpretation of alternate possibilities that avoid such commitments. On the other hand, Yeomans is very clear in showing how deep the revisions are that Hegel undertakes in his Logic concerning central notions of causality, determinism and necessity (to name some of the most important). Starting from this point, the reader might wonder whether in this Hegelian framework we find a solution to the traditional problem or rather its dissolution. It would have been at least an option for Yeomans to try out an understanding of Hegel's conception of free will in such a way that it presupposes a therapeutic stance towards the classical metaphysical problem of free will.

Closely related to this is a second problem. It is one thing to show that an expressivist and social reading of Hegel's philosophy of action (and, I would like to add, of mind) must include causal elements. It is a different thing to claim that the central conceptual moves included in such a conception (including saving teleology as an important and maybe even the basic form of explanation) directly commit one to an answer within the classical metaphysical debate concerning free will. I may well be wrong about this, and future readers of Freedom and Reflection will better understand the connection the author has had in mind, but my impression was that at this point Yeomans too quickly confounds two different philosophical projects in his reconstruction of Hegel's philosophy of action.

It is well known and established beyond doubt that a philosophical mission may fail and succeed for different reasons. One main reason can be unfavorable circumstances such as finding no readers sufficiently familiar both with Hegel and analytical philosophy or with both with Hegel scholarship and systematic problems. Fortunately, over the last twenty years or so these gaps have been at least partly bridged. Therefore I am quite optimistic that Yeomans' book will find some readers qualified to deal with his complex analysis and profit from studying his arguments.

Another main reason why a philosophical study may fail to achieve its goal can be that this very goal has not been identified clearly (enough). As I said above my impression is that Yeomans sometimes runs the risk of failing in this sense.  It is not clear whether he wants to show that Hegel solves the classical metaphysical problem of free will or whether his aim is to show that Hegel dissolves this problem by criticizing the premises needed to establish it in the first place (I admit that I am more sympathetic with the latter, therapeutic reading). Given the complexity of the problems and the difficulties of Hegel's own conception, I leave it to other readers to decide whether Yeomans' overall argument isn't sufficiently clear on this or whether the reviewer has been pressed to his limits by this book.

A third main reason for failing to reach the main goal can be that the task set was simply too difficult. Dealing with Hegel's logic of reflection, his conception of the will, his expressivist theory of mind and action and the classical metaphysical problem of free will both in the context of German Idealism and contemporary analytical philosophy at once may well be a target too demanding for a single book. This, too, I leave to the reader to decide.

My expressing these doubts shouldn't be misunderstood: Even if it is the case that Yeomans fails in reaching his complex overall goal, his book is a 'great failure' in at least two respects. On the one hand, he comes as close as one may be able to come; and on the other hand, the book provides so many important insights and analyses that every reader will have the chance to learn a lot and to gain a much better understanding of Hegel's philosophy of action and of his conception of freedom. Furthermore, Yeomans demonstrates how we can read Hegel's Logic in such a way that this prima facie unapproachable ground of metaphysics becomes accessible for us contemporary philosophers. Seen this way Yeomans has done a great job and I cannot do more than express my hope that his book will find many readers with the staying power necessary to make it through Freedom and Reflection.