Freedom and Responsibility in Neoplatonist Thought

Freedom And Responsibility In Neoplatonist Thought

Ursula Coope, Freedom and Responsibility in Neoplatonist Thought, Oxford University Press, 2020, 288pp., $77.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198824831.

Reviewed by John Dillon, Trinity College Dublin


Ursula Coope’s book is a most impressive volume, and all the more valuable as being from the pen of a distinguished classically-trained historian of philosophy, who is able to apply the most rigorous logical analysis to the philosophical positions of such thinkers as Plotinus, Iamblichus, Proclus­—and indeed Damascius, and other thinkers of the Damascian school. It concerns the very distinctive views on freedom and the allied concept of responsibility put forward by Plotinus, and developed or modified by various later Platonists, primarily Proclus, but also Damascius, Simplicius, and Pseudo-Simplicius, and I must say that it casts much light on the nature and rationale of their positions.

The book is divided into three parts. The first, entitled ‘The Puzzles’, in four chapters, presents the background to the Neoplatonic theories of freedom and responsibility, in Plato himself, the Stoics, and Aristotle and later Peripatetics, primarily Alexander of Aphrodisias. Stoic views on the freedom of the Sage, and the concept of ‘what depends on us’ (to eph’ hêmin), in face of the inexorability of Fate, are of particular significance here, as Plotinus’ position largely grows out of this. Alexander is also an important influence, in his efforts to counter Stoic fatalism.

The second part, ‘Freedom’, again comprising four chapters (‘Freedom and the One’, ‘Under the One but in Control of Oneself’, ‘Self-Making and Nonbodiliness’, and ‘Freedom, Dependence and Being a Part’), turns out to be a close critique, first of all, of a series of key sections of certain Plotinian tractates, namely VI 8, 1–6, on the subject of human free will, with considerable attention paid also to various later parts of the tractate, concerning the freedom of the One; a number of key passages of IV 3–4 (‘Problems of the Soul’); and of III 2–3 (‘On Providence’)—this latter much utilised also in relation to the topic of Responsibility. Plotinus, however, on the subjects of both Freedom and Responsibility, goes out on something of a limb by postulating an aspect of the human soul that ‘does not descend’, but rather remains in the noetic realm, in union with Intellect (and is thus not even, strictly speaking, a soul, but rather an individual nous), which in this context serves as a sort of agent of our intellectual freedom; in this idiosyncratic view, however, he is not followed by later thinkers in the tradition, from Iamblichus on, and thus Proclus, for instance, has to attribute our autonomy to the ‘essential inner activity’ of the human soul, which constitutes itself by reverting upon itself. All this is excellently set out and discussed by Coope.

One detail of her critique, I must say, I found particularly impressive, and that was her adducing of Iamblichus’ Letter to Macedonius on Fate as an illustration of his distinctive view of the nature of human freedom (106–9). The Letters would not, one would think, be the most obvious source from which to derive core Iamblichean doctrines, but in fact this letter contains by far the best and clearest statement of his position. Since he rejects the Plotinian postulate of an undescended part of the soul, he fixes on the ‘essential nature’ (ousia) of the soul, which is “immaterial, incorporeal, completely exempt from generation and destruction . . . and contains within itself a life that is both self-determined and independent” (Fr. 2). This performs more or less the same function as would Plotinus’ highest part of the soul, but with the difference that it can be corrupted—though it never completely abandons its true nature. This is realistic, but, as I think Plotinus would feel, a bit messy. The fall from the ‘freedom’ of purely intellectual activity to enslavement to the passions and external physical forces can be arrested and reversed, but exactly how is a rather difficult question. However, Coope’s discussion of the problem is excellent.

The third part, devoted to the concept of Responsibility, also consists of four chapters (‘Responsibility and the Myth of Er’, ‘Plotinus on Responsibility and Having a Free Principle’, ‘Proclus on Self-Movement and the logoi Within’, ‘Rational Assent and Self-determination to the Better or the Worse’), and addresses the various troublesome ramifications of the concept of moral responsibility, where ‘freedom’ is identified with ‘perfect activity’—either intellection, or at least acts of practical virtue—and vicious behaviour is generally associated with enslavement to passions or to external influences. This tension between the two concepts is exacerbated by a doctrine of reincarnation and antenatal determinism, as exemplified by the Myth of Er of Republic X—on which Proclus, in particular, has a good deal to say, but which Plotinus also has to reckon with, as does his immediate follower Porphyry, particularly in his treatise On What Depends on Us. Their solution, such as it is, and which Coope expounds most copiously and sympathetically, is broadly that we may not be responsible for our actions when already enslaved by the passions, but we are responsible for allowing ourselves to slip in that direction in the first place. The issue of moral and legal responsibility for our actions is one that bedevils the lawcourts, as well as the departments of philosophy, of the present day, and it cannot be expected that the Neoplatonist philosophers came up with solutions that are fully satisfactory, but Coope does the best for them, bringing in also the ruminations of Damascius, Simplicius, and the rather mysterious Pseudo-Simplicius, who writes a commentary on Aristotle’s De Anima, and may be identical with Simplicius’ colleague Priscian—and who is himself much dependent on Iamblichus.

The agreed basis for our responsibility for our actions, and our course of life generally, has to be, as agreed by both Plotinus and his successors, our retention of some degree of reminiscence, either of our undescended part, or (in Proclus’ terms) of our intellectual essence, from which logoi stream down into the lower levels of the soul, and to which we need to hearken; we can be blamed for not doing so. This may be viewed by some modern philosophers as less than satisfactory as an account of responsibility, but to me it seems a reasonable response to a problem which remains largely intractable, and Coope gives a fine account of it. As she remarks at the outset (7):

One of the main challenges we face in trying to make sense of the Neoplatonist philosophers is to understand the puzzles that motivated their discussions. We cannot assume that the questions they were trying to answer were just the same as the questions that arise in modern discussions of freedom and responsibility. Nor can we assume that they understood the terms that we translate as ‘freedom’, voluntariness’, ‘depends on us’, and so on, in ways that such terms are naturally understood by us—imagine trying to give a single uncontentious definition of the notion of freedom as it appears in modern philosophical discussions!—and similarly, there is no single uncontentious way in which such terms were understood by our Neoplatonist authors. Thus we cannot bridge this gap between our understanding and theirs simply by providing definitions of the relevant terms.

I would thoroughly endorse her remarks here, but I feel that she has in this book made a valiant effort to bridge the gap, and it is a largely successful one that should be of interest to all serious philosophers.

All in all, then, this is a masterful treatment of an allied pair of difficult but fascinating topics, rounded off with a copious bibliography, index locorum, and general index.