Freedom and Tradition in Hegel: Reconsidering Anthropology, Ethics, and Religion

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Thomas A. Lewis, Freedom and Tradition in Hegel: Reconsidering Anthropology, Ethics, and Religion, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 272pp, $32.50 (hbk), ISBN 0268033684.

Reviewed by Allen Speight, Boston University


The last thirty years of Hegelian scholarship in the Anglophone world have been marked both by a general reappreciation of Hegel's ethical, social and political philosophy and by important interpretive differences over the role of systematic issues in that reappreciation. That Hegel should be viewed not as an apologist for Prussian authoritarianism but rather as the originator of a philosophical approach sharing at least some common concerns with the liberal tradition is a stance that is now taken for granted in the contemporary secondary philosophical literature. Yet, in the years (loosely speaking) between Popper's Open Society and Its Enemies (1945) and Shlomo Avineri's defense of Hegel in Hegel's Theory of the Modern State (1972), such an appreciation was anything but conventional in the English-speaking philosophical world.

The greater recent attention devoted to Hegel's ethical, social and political philosophy has, at the same time, opened up important methodological divisions among his most prominent contemporary interpreters. Some commentators (perhaps most notably Allen Wood, in his 1990 Hegel's Ethical Thought, and Fred Neuhouser in his 2000 Foundations of Hegel's Social Theory) have made a case for Hegel by jettisoning systematic concerns and focusing instead on how Hegel's approach to ethics and politics can be shown to fit within the aims of other normative stances in contemporary philosophy. Other commentators have tried instead to place Hegel's ethical and political project in the larger context of a reinterpretation of Hegel's broader philosophical aims.

Lewis' book follows the interest in a reappropriation of Hegel's ethical, social and political philosophy and casts its lot among the recent readers who have stressed the importance of systematic concerns. His general task is to explore the complicated issue of "freedom and tradition" in Hegel from the perspective of Hegel's philosophical anthropology—construed here in the broad sense of philosophical anthropology more generally, not just in terms of the first part of the doctrine of subjective spirit, which Hegel labels Anthropologie. Lewis' project is thus concerned with centering Hegel's ethical, social and political theory in the wider systematic issues that surround the notion of spirit. More specifically, his reading endeavors to show what might be gained by comparing Hegel's notion of "objective" spirit (the realm of ethical institutions sketched in the Philosophy of Right, including the family, civil society and the state) with "subjective" spirit (the issues Hegel raises in his discussions of anthropology, phenomenology and psychology).

The essential philosophical claim underlying Lewis' project can be found in Adriaan Peperzak's notable remark that Hegel's anthropology is "at the same time a fundamental ethics." In the development of his argument for this claim, Lewis draws especially on recent scholarly work on the German text of Hegel's lectures on the philosophy of spirit, edited by Franz Hespe and Burkhard Tuschling (1994), and on the significant changes Hegel made to his Encyclopedia account of subjective spirit over its three editions, accessible to English readers in M. J. Petry's three-volume translation (1978).

What is Hegel's philosophical anthropology, then? It cannot, of course, given his philosophical commitments, be construed either in naturalistic or essentialistic terms. Lewis formulates it instead in terms of an account of "what is implicit as a structure rather than a set of tendencies or dispositions." This formulation picks up Hegel's remark in the Lectures on the Philosophy of Spirit that "the human being ought to produce himself, but he can make himself into nothing other than … what he originally, implicitly, is. That which he implicitly is is what one calls an endowment [Anlage]."

This relation between implicit human endowment and what an individual becomes through his own activity is central, as Lewis notes, to Hegelian as to Aristotelian ethics. Lewis claims that "for both Aristotle and Hegel ethics cannot be derived solely from what it means to be a rational agent, but follows from a philosophical anthropology." Yet perhaps this formulation frames the issue already in terms that are too opposed. For Hegel, the account of what it means for an agent to be a rational agent must be linked to an account of how the implicit rationality in an agent's desires and impulses emerges into a more explicitly rational form. The natural will's impulses (its desires for property and family, for example) have an only implicitly rational form until they are brought into a process which Hegel refers to variously as the Bildung (formation) or Aufheben (sublation) or even Reinigung (purification) of impulses and become part of the genuine rationality in which the ethical agent "wills his own freedom" in association with the attachments of ethical life (the rational ethical institutions of family or property right). This Hegelian account of the move from implicitly to explicitly rational impulses might have been more fully developed in Lewis' discussion.

One especially important related issue about the implicit rational structure of human agency that might have also been developed further in this regard is Lewis' interesting formulation about Hegel's notion of action and the corresponding relation between theory and practice that it suggests. On Lewis' view, that relation is characterized by three moments: (i) what might be regarded as an agent's not yet fully explicit "pre-understanding" of what he is to do prior to action, (ii) the action itself, and (iii) the later comprehension of that action, a comprehension which might require revision in the light of what has emerged. Lewis suggests as an example what participants in the civil rights movement might have said as they took part in the initial campaigns and what can be construed later, in the light of retrospective consideration, about the actions that were undertaken.

In his discussion of the relation between theory and practice in Hegel, Lewis is right to stress Hegel's later move in the 1830 edition of the Encyclopedia toward a synthetic third section emerging from the account of theoretical and practical spirit in "Psychology." In the earlier editions of the Encyclopedia, Hegel had made a direct transition to objective spirit from practical spirit as the final moment of subjective spirit, but in 1830 instead brings the theoretical and practical moments of spirit together as "free spirit" before going on to the further transition. A comparison here of what ultimately developed in Hegel's treatment of subjective spirit is useful to put beside the perhaps better-known remarks connecting theoretical and practical sides of spirit in the introduction to the Philosophy of Right.

Given his project of reading the account of objective spirit in the light of subjective spirit, Lewis puts great stress on a reading of Hegel's account of habit (Gewohnheit) when he considers the Hegelian treatment of issues such as the role that tradition -- whether political, ethical or religious -- plays in his larger account of human freedom. There are some difficulties with this reading. It is true, as Lewis points out, that Hegel has a larger sense of the notion of habit, visible in his remark in the lectures on the philosophy of spirit that "what I am is the totality of my habits." But, as Lewis also acknowledges, there does seem to be a significant difference in terms of how Hegel discusses habit in his treatments of subjective and objective spirit respectively. In the account of subjective spirit, Hegel's account of habit is devoted to an apparently quite immediate set of physical relations and abilities: (a) an agent's ability to become "hardened" against cold and sensation, (b) an agent's indifference to satisfaction, and (c) habitual skill. There is thus something of a slide between these more direct concerns with sensation, impulse, and skill and the larger process Lewis wants to identify as "the process by which we come to be constituted by our context" when it comes to the political, ethical and religious traditions we inhabit. The Philosophy of Right's brief treatment of habit (PRspirit living and present as a world."

A central part of Lewis' project of comparing Hegel's treatments of subjective and objective spirit is the exploration of what he sees as a tension between the "inherent" egalitarianism of subjective spirit and the structures of differentiation or articulation that Hegel took to be necessary within a developed state. From the view of subjective spirit, Lewis argues, one might see the habitual relations essential to family life as important to the life of an individual as such, but question whether it is necessary to confine one gender (as much in Hegel's PR account of the divided roles between men and women in the family seems to suggest) to this level alone. In seeking to show how Hegel's political philosophy is compatible with contemporary egalitarian concerns, Lewis' argument thus follows in an important way the conclusions of recent studies like Neuhouser's but adds corroborating evidence from Hegel's broader systematic interests.

A final chapter on Hegel's philosophy of religion raises perhaps more questions than it (or any relatively brief account of Hegel's view of the relation between tradition and freedom) can resolve. Central to Lewis' account here is Hegel's important notion of the cultus, which, he suggests, "moves between a largely preconscious level associated with habituation and a more conscious level in which actions express a particular understanding of Spirit." What this analysis might suggest about Hegel's own account of the relation between religion and philosophical knowledge -- Hegel does say that philosophy itself must be a form of "continual cultus" -- remains a question that perhaps will be illuminated in Lewis' future work.

The tension in Hegel's philosophical stance between tradition and freedom is, as Lewis wisely notes, a dynamic one. As Terry Pinkard's recent biography has emphasized, Hegel's own trajectory through the world-historical events following the French and Kantian revolutions was one that pulled always between the poles of tradition-exploding rationality and the articulated social structures which he thought necessary to avoid repeating the social dissolution associated with moments like the Reign of Terror. Lewis' book is a helpful addition to the exploration of that tension and, given the breadth of its scope, should be welcomed by those with interests not only in Hegel's ethical and political philosophy but also in his moral psychology and philosophy of religion.