Freedom of Expression in a Diverse World

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Deirdre Golash (ed.), Freedom of Expression in a Diverse World, Springer, 2010, 215pp., $139.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789048189984.

Reviewed by Jorn Sonderholm, George Washington University


This volume is a collection of essays originating from a 2008 meeting of The American Section of the International Association for the Philosophy of Law and Social Philosophy (AMINTAPHIL). It is the third in the AMINTAPHIL book series (edited by Mortimer Sellers) which considers the philosophical foundations of law and justice from the perspectives of academic philosophy, practical political science and applied legal studies. It has three parts: Part I "Why Free Speech?",Part II "Proscribed Speech: The Limits of Free Expression"and Part III "Intersections with Other Rights". In addition to the editor's introduction, it includes 14 essays. In the words of the editor,

the essays in the volume seek to illuminate why we value freedom of speech and expression and how this freedom can be weighed against other values, such as multicultural sensitivity, the rights of racial and sexual minorities, and the prevention of violence, both domestically and internationally (back cover).

I will first provide a brief overview of the essays and then discuss one of them in some detail before offering some brief, general remarks on the strengths and weaknesses of the volume as a whole. At the outset, it should be made clear that Deirdre Golash has edited a very readable book that will be of special interest to readers who are somewhat acquainted with the general themes and issues in the freedom of speech literature.

The first three essays in Part I analyze the 'marketplace of ideas' argument for freedom of speech. The familiar argument might be labeled Millian after John Stuart Mill, an influential proponent of it. Mill argued that in a 'marketplace of ideas', good ideas (truths) would displace bad ones (falsehoods).

The opening essay, by Richard Barron Parker, is entitled "Free Speech and the Social Technologies of Democracy, Scientific Inquiry and the Free Market". Parker's main thesis is that over the past two centuries, nations have flourished or failed to flourish to the degree that they have adopted the social practice of scientific inquiry, democracy and the free market, each of which requires freedom of speech. Parker paints his picture with a big brush in order to capture general insights that do not emerge from a low-altitude "aerial picture of world history over the past two centuries" (p. 3).

In "Hate Speech in the Marketplace of Ideas", Steven Lee discusses the analogy between the marketplace of ideas and the marketplace for goods. He finds some similarities between the two, but denies that the marketplace of ideas must be left unregulated. Just as the market for goods is not optimal when unregulated (because of, say, the emergence of cartels), it is proper that the marketplace of ideas also be regulated to some extent. Lee is especially in favor of restrictions on hate speech.

In "The "Marketplace of Ideas:" A Siren Song for Freedom of Speech Theorists", Jonathan Schonsheck continues the discussion of the marketplace of ideas argument. Schonsheck is not impressed with the argument. He argues that exchange, possession and competition are not the same in the marketplace of ideas as in the marketplace for goods; as a result, the postulated analogy between the two marketplaces is rather weak.

The next essay, Helga Varden's "A Kantian Conception of Free Speech", is the only one in the volume that draws on the history of philosophy. Full appreciation of this essay requires some previous knowledge of Kant's thought, but the essay is well-written. Varden argues that Kant's position can contribute significantly to the current debate about freedom of speech. She pays particular attention to Kant's distinctions between virtue and right and between private and public right. Varden is of the opinion that these distinctions help clarify and justify distinctions in liberal law such as distinctions between free speech, seditious speech, hate speech, harassment and defamation.

The essays in Part II discuss the broad range of cases in which the value of freedom of expression collides with the value of other things such as, e.g., the prevention of sexual discrimination, hate speech and religious discrimination. In the first of these, "Is It Immoral to Prohibit Sexually Harassing Speech in the Classroom?", Thomas Peard discusses sexually harassing speech in the classroom. Building on Joel Feinberg's harm and offense principles, he argues that the legal regulation of sexually harassing speech does not in itself wrongly interfere with the speaker's right to freedom of expression.

In "The Morality of Using 'Nigger'", Rodney C. Roberts argues for the thesis that there is a moral difference between whites using 'Nigger' (or 'Nigga') and blacks using this term. When whites use it (even with good intentions), they are doing something that is morally objectionable. Blacks' use of the term is not morally objectionable, though their use of it is still offensive.

Larry May considers the legal case brought against three Rwandans for their involvement in the 1994 genocide in "Incitement to Genocide and the Rwanda Media Case". May does a conceptual analysis of the term 'incitement' and argues that this term is best understood to involve the intention to take actions that initiate a causal chain known to risk serious harm. Based on his analysis, May takes issue with the rulings of the Media Case Trial Chamber of the International Criminal Tribunal for Rwanda.

The next two essays revolve around the ban in France on the wearing of religious garb in public schools. The essays have a special emphasis on the hijab (headscarf) worn by Muslim women. Anita Allen's and Christine Sistare's respective essays "Hijabs and Headwraps: The Case for Tolerance" and "'Conspicuous' Religious Symbols and Laïcité" argue for incompatible conclusions. Allen is against the ban on the ground that the wearing of the hijab does not impinge on any important policy area and is merely a symbol of personal choice and feminine modesty. Opposed to this, Sistare argues that the ban is defensible when seen in a French context that involves the Wars of Religion in the sixteenth century. The state that emerged from the French Revolution has as one of its most important tasks the protection of individuals from religious indoctrination and proselytism. That state is therefore justified in taking steps to secure a religiously neutral environment in its schools.

Part III opens with "When Free Speech Meets Free Association: The Case of the Boy Scouts" by Emily R. Gill. Gill focuses on the tension between freedom of expression and freedom of association and illustrates the broader theoretical issue by making reference to a legal case in which the Boy Scouts attempted to exclude an assistant scoutmaster on the ground that he was openly homosexual. Gill argues that the Boy Scouts should not be required to accept those who disagree with the message embraced by the Boy Scouts Association.

In the next essay, "Oaths and the Pledge of Allegiance: Freedom of Expression and the Right to be Silent", Kenneth Henley argues that the right not to express oneself (e.g., refusing to pledge allegiance to the flag or refusing to answer questions about one's religious beliefs when seeking political office) is central to the right of freedom of expression. Henley concedes that seekers of political office are not subject to formal religious tests, but points out that refusing to answer questions about one's religious beliefs will immediately be taken to establish a lack of acceptable creed.

Wade L. Robison argues in "Speaking Freely" that privacy in the sense of being able to choose one's audience is a necessary condition for freedom of speech to have any value. Robison places this claim in a contemporary context in which governments have easy, cheap and effective ways of intruding on individuals' private conversations. Such intrusive behavior impinges, according to Robison, on citizens' ability to speak freely and it therefore diminishes the value of freedom of speech.

In the final essay of the volume, "Social Institutions, Transgendered Lives, and the Scope of Free Expression", Richard Nunan examines the ideological implications of the legal landscape governing marriage as it affects transgendered individuals. One of Nunan's claims is that transgender individuals who do not fit neatly into the gender binary experience a denial of their freedom of expression insofar as they are not allowed to marry their partner (the reason being that they, according to the authorities that license marriage, have the same sex as their partner).

Let me now turn to a discussion of Alistair M. MacLeod's contribution "Free Speech, Equal Opportunity, and Justice" in Part I. MacLeod argues for three claims: (1) that "the reasons for valuing freedom of speech have force only in certain of the contexts in which (and only for certain of the purposes for which) freedom of speech can be exercised", (2) that "the moral right to freedom of speech must be supported not only by reference to the reasons that give freedom of speech its value but also by appeal to principles of distributive justice", and (3) that

while the state, as a guardian of freedom of speech, must adopt measures both to prevent interference with freedom of speech and to provide opportunities for the effective exercise of freedom of speech, responsibilities of both these kinds must also be discharged by individuals and agencies in the private sector (p. 57).

For the sake of brevity, I focus on MacLeod's views about the role of the state in protecting free speech. His claim that the state has an important role to play in preventing interference with freedom of speech is rather uncontroversial. However, other views of MacLeod's are not. These are: (i) the state has a role to play in facilitating effective exercise of the freedom of speech, and (ii) the state has a role to play in providing readily seizable opportunities for the exercise of freedom of speech (p. 67). In order for such opportunities to be provided, the state must offer (perhaps in partnership with the private sector) "ready access to the 'forums' in which political debate takes place and in which, consequently, it is important for the political views of a society's members to be communicated and discussed" (p. 69).

I am rather skeptical about (i) and (ii). To suggest that the state has a role to play in making sure that ordinary people are not only free to communicate their views, but also have the ability to do this in an effective manner, is to saddle it with too many obligations. Leaving the issue behind of what exactly 'effective' means, it seems to me that the state has fulfilled its obligations with respect to freedom of speech if and only if it has secured political conditions in which members of the public can express their views (subject to certain minimal constraints). It is a sufficient condition (together with a number of other conditions that have nothing to do with the effectiveness with which one can express one's view) for a state to have secured freedom of speech that its members can walk down to the local 'speakers' corner', step up on a box and express their views about, say, the reasonableness of the government's policies, the moral nature of homosexuality, the Deity's mind and the existence of the Holocaust.

But MacLeod wants more. According to him, we only have proper freedom of speech if the speakers at the corner (or on the blog) are well-articulated and trained in the discipline of getting their message effectively across. They should not only be allowed to speak, but they should also be entitled to training/resources (sometimes fully or partly funded through forced taxation) that allow them to speak effectively and allow them to speak from an appropriate/influential political platform.

It seems to me that this view is mistaken. The issue of freedom of speech is best restricted to being an issue about what the reasonable constraints are on various forms of speech. It is not an issue of effectiveness in communication to the effect that a state can be said to unjustifiably restrict the freedom of speech for its citizens on the ground that not all of these individuals know how to present their views in an effective manner or do not have access to the pages of The New York Times or shows on CNN. Access to these platforms is a privilege that one has to earn: it is not, and should not be, a (expensive) gift that the state at least in some cases is required to either fully or partly fund. It might be good/desirable if the state (perhaps in partnership with the private sector) makes sure that its denizens are effective in getting their views (political or otherwise) across and have equal opportunity to do so, but to argue that this actually is the case is to take a stand on grand issues in political philosophy that go well beyond (and should not be conflated with) the issue of freedom of speech.

The well-written essay by MacLeod is a good example of what I take to be an overall strength of the book: it presents an array of intriguing ideas such that most readers are sure to find something to engage with intellectually. The book also does a good job in terms of making clear the close connection between legal rulings and philosophical reasoning. The book is full of illustrative references to court cases in the US legal system in which the philosopher's sometimes rather theoretical reasoning finds a very practical outlet. Golash also deserves praise for having written a good introduction to the volume in which the various issues debated are put in perspective. The introduction, moreover, gives the selective reader a useful outline of the individual essays.

When it comes to the volume's weaknesses, a few come to mind. First, it covers a lot of ground. It would perhaps have been preferable to have had a stronger focus on a more limited number of topics. As mentioned, the first three essays in Part I analyze the 'marketplace of ideas' argument for freedom of speech. These three essays offer an interesting, sustained discussion. After that, there is no strong common thread that binds the essays together (though the essays by Allen and Sistare are on the same topic). Second, a few of the essays come across as a bit lightweight and do not contribute significantly to the volume's quality. I leave it to readers to judge for themselves whether this is a fair assessment. Moreover, I encourage them to do so. This volume deserves attention.