Freedom, Teleology, and Evil

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Stewart Goetz, Freedom, Teleology, and Evil, Continuum, 2008, 216pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847064813.

Reviewed by Evan Fales, University of Iowa



This lively work presents, defends, and draws out some implications of an original libertarian theory of free will. What is unusual about Goetz’s view is that it gives a non-causal account of free acts of volition. Such views are in short supply. Goetz has one and he has here undertaken a full and much-needed exposition and defense. The key ingredient in the reigning libertarian view is agent-causation, whereas the key ingredient in Goetz’s theory is an “essentially uncaused exercising of the (intrinsically active mental) power to choose” from options in the light of competing reasons (pp. 18, 19). This idea is fleshed out with a discussion of the ontology of the mental act of choosing, and its relation to reasons. Reasons, Goetz holds, provide teleological explanations for actions without standing in causal relations to them. Irrational action is a matter of choosing for a reason as well, but for a reason that ought to have been overridden. Why wasn’t it? There need be no further explanation for that.

What follows is a chapter devoted to explaining why this conception of freedom does not make choice a matter of luck, i.e. a matter of random outcomes; a lengthy chapter devoted to a defense of (a version of) the Principle of Alternatives (PAP) against a series of putative Frankfurt counterexamples; and a final chapter devoted to the problem of evil and an interesting theodicy.

Agent-causation views are prey to two intrinsic weaknesses. First, although the relation of causation employed is no different from that in play in event-event causation, one relatum of the relation is a categorically different item: an agent qua particular, abstracted from its properties (what Armstrong calls a “thin” particular). Because an agent so unqualified is not distinguishable from any other particular, it is mysterious why it has such causal powers, and even how such a thing could have causal powers at all, apart from or anyway not in virtue of powers conferred by its properties. Second, agent-causation theorists have trouble showing how such a view can be compatible with reasons-explanations of behavior. Does Goetz’s view avoid these very problems?

At bottom, Goetz’s analysis rests upon the notion of a mental power that, because it is “intrinsically active”, requires nothing to cause its exercise. What is this mental power, and what is the relation between its exercise and a choice? We ordinarily think of powers as operating causally and in accordance with causal laws: suitable conditions trigger their exercise; i.e., they, together with those conditions, cause some event (alternatively, the conditions cause the exercise of the power). Nevertheless that isn’t the way Goetz thinks of the power in question. He holds that mental powers are ontologically fundamental, and that no exercisings of them can be caused. They are properties, it seems, whose instances are intrinsically active, but not caused to act. What is the relation between such a power’s exercise and a choice? Not causal, certainly; Goetz holds that the choice — he must mean the act of choosing (that such-and-such be the case), not what is chosen — is “identical with … an exercising of the power to choose” (p. 10). Metaphysically, then, these powers are odd ducks, if not, perhaps, quite as odd as bare particulars that cause things to happen for no (sufficient) reason.

What evidence is there in support of Goetz’s appeal to such powers? That (free) choosings are intrinsically active, uncaused exercises of a mental power is something we know, according to Goetz, because that is what we experience choosing to be. The experience has no qualitative content — it is not a feeling of some kind — but it is an experience nonetheless, one that grounds a properly basic judgment that choosings are uncaused.

It is hard to know how to assess this claim. I do not, upon introspecting, discover any such experience of my choosings as not caused (or, for that matter, as caused). Perhaps my inner gaze is misdirected. What I do find is that my choosings are (in the most favored cases) just a matter of my deliberating about possible courses of action, and reaching a conclusion that produces an intention to pursue one of them — that is, to choose is just to execute a practical syllogism, to weigh competing reasons so as to bring into view my best course of action. (Some will immediately suggest that this amounts to a compatibilist view, as the outcome of deliberation is the outcome of a causal process, each stage of which causally determines the next. While the premises of a rational deliberation determine its outcome, however, it can be denied that this determination is a causal determination, and argued that determination [of this very kind] is necessary so as to provide an agent with the kind of control essential to responsibility. So there is another non-causal position available to the libertarian.)

Goetz, necessarily, must think of the relation between choices and their reasons differently. He does so by deploying the notion of teleological explanation that is “ultimate and irreducible”, necessary for an action to be a choice, but not what makes an action a choice (pp. 9-11). He thinks that teleological explanations are incompatible with naturalism, on the basis of a rather odd definition of naturalism as a rejection of such explanations (p. 4). They are, here, explanations of why someone chooses as he does in terms of the reasons he has. For an action to be free, it must be the case that the agent has both some reason for so acting and for which she acts, and that she also has some reason for not so acting. Absent such a competing reason, one can act intentionally, but not in virtue of a choice (p. 22).

Although acting for a reason is an entirely familiar matter, I am not sure that Goetz offers much help in understanding what kind of relation it expresses between reason and action. To speak, as Goetz does, of purposes and of a future-to-present direction of fit is not especially helpful. Critics will notice that although that direction relates the envisioned future state to the action intended to achieve it, it does not relate the prior mental states (entertaining reasons, forming an intention) to the action (p. 20). It is the prior mental states, one would think, that do the explaining.1 Putting the matter compactly, the relation Goetz posits between explanation of actions and production of an action seems not intimate enough. In this respect it is rather reminiscent of efforts to incorporate an explanatory role for reasons into agent-causation accounts of free choice.

Goetz discusses with some care the question of how freely choosing can involve the exertion of control over what one does. The problem is that control appears to be a causal notion, whereas the libertarian breaks free of causation. Contra Mele, Goetz maintains that free choice involves a non-causal species of control. Contra O’Connor, he maintains that it is as plausible to maintain that the exercise of a power to choose is free of causal determination as it is to hold that agent-causings are themselves uncaused. I think, on behalf of O’Connor, that one should demand a metaphysically satisfying account of this mental power, and of its exercise, that eschews causation. Can such a power really be ontologically primitive?

Why isn’t the exercise of such a power in favor of one choice rather than another a matter of “luck” if not causally determined? Goetz discusses objections from van Inwagen, Nagel, Strawson, Mele, and Kane. In particular, isn’t the character, personality, and motivational structure (CPM) of an agent not up to theaagent, and therefore not something for which that agent can be held responsible? Further, doesn’t that (together with circumstances) provide the agent’s reasons for choosing? Goetz, however, holds that one’s CPM isn’t a matter of luck (it results from a combination of past choices and facts about human nature over which we exercise no choice), and doesn’t cause our choices.

Chapter 5 — by far the longest in the book — is an extended defense of a version of the Principle of Alternative Possibilities, especially against a variety of putative Frankfurt-style counterexamples. Here Goetz mobilizes and defends Widerker’s reply to Frankfurt counterexamples, providing extended replies to his critics, including Stump, Mele and Robb, and especially Fischer, among others. Finally, he defends against Widerker’s own Frankfurt counterexample.

It would be impossible to summarize this engaging debate here, but I want to note with some surprise a claim that Goetz makes in the course of his reply to Stump (pp. 80-81). He tells us that, in his view, no bodily acts are free in the libertarian sense (because they are causally determined); only choices (which are mental acts) are free. Is this a freedom worth wanting? Suppose that, hiking in the Alps, I come to a fork in the path. The left (less traveled) winds arduously up a mountain to a spectacular vista. The right descends to an excellent restaurant. I relish vistas, but the weather looks chancy and I am hungry; my choice is to go right. To my astonishment and dismay, however, my legs inexorably carry me up the mountain. If my bodily movements are causally determined, how could they manage to be responsive to my choices? Alternately, if they are responsive to undetermined choices, how can they be causally determined? In short, how can my movements count as actions — embodiers of my purposes and items for which I can be held responsible — if they are caused and thus disconnected from my choices? How valuable can “mental” freedom be, if uncoupled from control over our bodies? One would think, therefore, that Goetz should accept Cartesian dualism. If he doesn’t, he has some explaining to do.

In his last chapter, Goetz turns to theology and tackles the problem of evil. He proposes, not merely a defense, but a theodicy. First, he considers two preliminary issues: How often do we have opportunity to exercise libertarian free will? And how do our free choices bear upon the formation of our selves, and upon our “projects” or life-plans?

It might seem (given Goetz’s account of freedom) that we have rather sparse opportunity to exercise our wills freely. For such exercise only becomes available when we have competing choices, that is, when we have reasons both for and against the formation of an intention to perform an action A. There are many intentions we form deliberately but “automatically” where the reasons all fall on one side. Unless we desire, are tempted, or have some inclination not to A, the question of choice does not arise. This, Goetz thinks, is quite ordinarily the case (but no cause for dismay). Indeed, what we recognize as reasons is constrained by past choices we have made, choices that form the selves we are by settling questions concerning our long-range commitments and plans.

It is unclear, however, why Goetz thinks that many — apparently most — of the “mindful” actions we perform are un-chosen. To be sure, a great many of our actions are performed without so much as reflectively entertaining what reasons we might have in their favor or against. Much action, for example, is habitual. Nevertheless where reasons come into play, we manage much of the time to find some reason both for and against a contemplated action. In a dark alley at midnight, a burly thief aims his gun at my head and demands my money. I have no doubts that my life is worth more to me than the $20, but even so, I’m a bit pig-headed and resent being ordered around. Still, I have no hesitation in seeing that indulging that resentment is foolish. Have I, by Goetz’s lights, chosen freely in this circumstance? If so, then I think free choice is a common, every-day phenomenon indeed. If not, then how strong do opposing reasons have to be?

In the development of a theodicy, Goetz begins with an argument that purports to show that a free-will defense commits one to a theodicy: viz., to the proposition that the creation of beings with libertarian freedom is a good that outweighs the moral evil in our world (p. 133). This is a mistake. What the defender needs to show is only that, for all we know, the risk-weighted possibilities for moral evil are outweighed by the probability-weighted goods attending libertarian freedom. But of course a theodicy, if it can be had, is better in any case than a mere defense. Can it be had?

Goetz’s entry, as I understand it, goes like this. If we compare two individuals equal with respect to the total balance of pain and felicity they experience (one whose early life is woe-beset and who in later life reaps good fortune, the other with the order of these fates reversed), we will consider the former more fortunate. Now, we are by nature such that the greatest fortune for which we can hope is a life that ultimately brings eternal and perfect felicity. God would not deny us such a life if He could grant it (as He can) and if we have earned it by pursuing by just means a self-forming (free) choice to seek perfect happiness. Making such a choice requires that we have libertarian freedom, and granting us such freedom means that God risks the possibility that we will do evil and harm others. Still, each of us can see that taking that risk is worth having the opportunity to achieve eternal perfect happiness.

This defense, so far as it goes, has a number of weaknesses. Let me note just two. First, the existence of the theistic God and the choices/consequences we are allegedly offered have not been well enough advertised. Many individuals have lived and do live in ignorance of them. So, while they might have hoped for perfect happiness, they have been unaware of its availability, and hence not in a position to choose it. If they nevertheless live a righteous life filled with considerable suffering, and are awarded beatitude, have they then been fairly treated? That seems doubtful on Goetz’s account, given the relevant absence of choice.

However, suppose they have heard the Christian Good News. Are they then in a position freely to choose justly a self-forming choice to pursue that happiness? Only, it seems, if they also have a reason not to do so. Goetz perhaps thinks that everyone has such reasons. As I noted above, however, it is unclear to me just how good a reason must be to serve as an opponent reason in free choice.

Second, Goetz’s theodicy doesn’t speak to the terminal suffering of non-human animals. For that he offers only a defense — but an unpersuasive one. It amounts to the claim that we just don’t know enough about the psychology of animals to know whether their suffering constitutes an evil. But it seems plain that we do know enough to know that.

This book provides not only a sustained presentation of one non-causal libertarian view, but also a detailed engagement with objections to it, and an excellent introduction to a substantial body of the current literature on the topic of free will. It makes a significant contribution to that literature and would make an excellent text for a graduate seminar.

1 I don’t see that much illumination is shed by Goetz’s comment that

a reason (purpose) that explains a choice is an optative conceptual entity (one expressing the idea that the world might be a certain way that is good … ). This implies that it is neither a propositional attitude (a belief or a desire, or the two combined) nor a propositionally structured entity with a truth value. (p. 20, Goetz’s italics)

But what sort of thing could “express the idea” that the world might be (come to be?) a certain good way, but lack a truth value?