Frege's Conception of Logic

Placeholder book cover

Patricia A. Blanchette, Frege's Conception of Logic, Oxford University Press, 2012, 190pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199891610.

Reviewed by Øystein Linnebo, Birkbeck, University of London/University of Oslo


The central concern of this rich little book is Frege's conception of logic and conceptual analysis. When Frege claims that arithmetical truths are nothing but logical truths, what exactly does he mean? Answering this question is essential to any proper assessment of Fregean logicism, and Blanchette's book is an admirable attempt to provide the required answer. The discussion is clear and balanced, impressive in its knowledge and analysis of the texts, and of substantial systematic interest.

Much of Frege's work consists of formal proofs of claims expressed in his formal language, Begriffsschrift. What is required for this technical work to advance Frege's philosophical goal of establishing the truth of logicism? Clearly, the basic principles of Frege's formal system must qualify as logical. Furthermore, the formalized claims must be appropriately related to the ordinary arithmetical claims that they purport to analyze; in particular, if the former is analytic, then so must be the latter. Both of these requirements are substantive and potentially hard to meet. Following the book itself, I will discuss the requirements in reverse order.

So let's begin with analysis (which, incidentally, seems as worthy of inclusion in the book's title as the word 'logic'). Consider Kant's contention that the judgment 7+5=12 is synthetic. Frege's response consists in part of a formal derivation of a sentence expressed in a language concerned with value ranges (which, roughly speaking, are Frege's version of classes). Even if Kant could be persuaded that the derivation is sound and devoid of extra-logical assumptions, he might still hold his ground. For how can the proof of a claim about value ranges establish anything about numbers? To establish that it does, Frege needs to show that the ordinary arithmetical sentence and his formal replacement share all relevant philosophical properties. This is supposed to be done by showing that the latter sentence provides an analysis of the former. Of course, this particular example is just an instance of a more general problem. Consider any ordinary arithmetical sentence. The formal counterpart that Frege sets out to prove from principles he regards as purely logical will prima facie look quite different from the ordinary sentence it is meant to analyze. Another example is Frege's brilliant formalization of the ancestral of a relation; although here Blanchette regards the difference as "not large" (p. 16). But in other cases the difference is indisputably large, for instance in the definition of 7 as the class of all (extensions of) heptuply instantiated concepts.

This brings us to the principal question of the first half of the book: What is analysis and which philosophically interesting properties does it preserve? In fact, it is instructive to distinguish between two more specific questions. One of these concerns the individuation of Fregean thoughts. How fine-grained are these entities? The second question concerns the relation between analysandum and analysans. These questions are discussed in chapters 2 and 4 respectively but turn out to be closely related.

Blanchette provides a wealth of textual evidence to show that Frege never reached a stable view on the individuation of thoughts but vacillated between two different criteria. One criterion says that thoughts are individuated by equipollence; that is, that two sentences express the same thought just in case they stand in exactly the same inferential relationships with all other sentences. Assuming that a worry about circularity can be assuaged, this yields a coarse-grained individuation of thoughts on which two sentences can express the same thought even unbeknownst to people competent with both sentences. An "intellectual achievement" may be required "to recognize of two sentences that they express the same thought" (p. 45). As is well know, this view of the individuation of thoughts is endorsed in Frege's early Begriffsschrift. In addition, Blanchette finds an expression of the view in a 1906 letter to Husserl. By contrast, a much more fine-grained individuation of thoughts is provided by the so-called cognitive criterion, according to which sentences differ in sense if (and perhaps only if) someone who understands both can rationally take different attitudes to the two.

It is perhaps unsurprising that Frege vacillated between these two criteria, for both encounter problems. On the coarse-grained criterion, a thought cannot be grasped simpliciter but only relative to a logical articulation. As Dummett observes (and Blanchette discusses), this sits poorly with the idea of thoughts as modes of presentation of truth-values since the mentioned logical articulation seems to be part of how the truth-value is presented and should thus be included as part of the thought. The more fine-grained cognitive criterion fares no better. One problem is that the resulting relation of synonymy is not obviously transitive, which calls into question the claim that the relation is an "equivalence" (p. 35). Moreover, the resulting thoughts will be much too fine-grained to be shared by matching instances of the two sides of an abstraction principle.

Let's turn now to the question of what is preserved under Fregean analysis. Probably the most natural view is that correct analysis ensures synonymy between analysandum and analysans and thus preservation of all philosophically interesting properties such as analyticity and apriority. However, Blanchette astutely observes that this view and the cognitive criterion for the individuation of thoughts together conflict with Frege's commitment to some highly non-trivial analyses (p. 81.  This follows since the mentioned two assumptions entail that, when someone familiar with two sentences can rationally take different attitudes towards them, neither sentence can be an analysis of the other. Another problem with the natural view is that it lacks textual support. In fact, even the much weaker requirement that reference be preserved is problematic, since Frege repeatedly emphasizes the availability of choice in his logical analysis of arithmetic, for instance in whether or not to invoke value ranges.

A much less demanding answer is that an acceptable analysis need only preserve inferential relations. One explication of this answer is in terms of the technical notion of an interpretation of one theory in another (that is, roughly, a recursive translation that sends each axiom of the former theory to a theorem of the latter). However, it is well known that many philosophically important properties are not preserved under interpretations. In fact, Frege already realized this. For although he knew that Euclidean geometry can be interpreted in mathematical analysis, he held that the former is synthetic a priori while the latter is analytic. However, Blanchette develops and defends another version of the less demanding answer, namely that analysandum and analysans must be logically equivalent -- in what Frege knew to be a strong logic that ensures the equivalence of the two sides of Basic Law V. This is an appealing interpretation, not least in light of the problems faced by its rivals -- although we of course know that Frege's logic is too strong.

Chapter 3 discusses the infamous requirement, often ascribed to Frege, that every function expressed in a logically perfect language be total in the strong sense that its domain be all-encompassing. This requirement threatens to open a gulf between natural languages and logically perfect ones since hardly any function expressed in natural language is total in this sense. Partially in order to forestall this conclusion, Blanchette seeks an interpretation of the relevant texts on which Frege only endorses a weaker requirement, namely "linguistic completeness" (p. 61), which says that every well-formed string of symbols must have a determinate reference (p. 60). Given Frege's semantics for quantifiers, linguistic completeness requires that every function be defined on any member of the domain. Thus, linguistic completeness will be weaker than the strong totality requirement only if Frege accepts domains that are less than universal. Although it is controversial whether Frege did accept this, Blanchette produces some evidence that he did.

The book's second half turns from Frege's conception of analysis to his conception of logic. The overarching -- and well-supported -- claim here is that Frege took logic to be concerned with thoughts, not syntactical items. Accordingly, axioms are meaningful statements, not just formal sentences; and proofs are sequences of thoughts, not of words. According to Blanchette, the claim provides the key to understanding the Frege-Hilbert dispute. Hilbert advocated the now-standard method for assessing questions of consistency, entailment, and independence by examining models of the claims in question. Frege objected that this method fails to keep fixed the thoughts whose logical relations are being examined and may thus yield incorrect verdicts. If Hilbert's method shows a claim to be inconsistent, then it really is so. But Frege rejects the converse. Although no inconsistency is forthcoming from the logical articulation of the claim examined by Hilbert, further analysis may overturn this verdict, and there is no safe way of establishing that one has arrived at an ultimate logical analysis of the claim in question. This observation sheds a great deal of light on aspects the Frege-Hilbert dispute, revealing it as "a clash between two quite different ways of understanding the fundamental notions of consistency and independence" (p. 110), and showing that each party is right when his favored understanding of these notions is brought to bear. Blanchette says less about other aspects of the dispute, such as the relation between consistency and mathematical existence.

Did Frege's conception of logic allow him to engage in metatheoretic reasoning of the sort involved in proofs of soundness and completeness? An influential "univeralist" interpretation due to van Heijenoort and Dreben claims not. The careful and balanced discussion of the ensuing controversy in chapter 7 is a welcome addition to the literature. Blanchette provides substantial textual evidence that Frege did engage in metatheoretic reasoning, for instance in his informal justification of his axioms and rules. Not surprisingly, this metatheoretic reasoning isn't as systematic as in later logicians, but it nevertheless demonstrates that Frege saw no deep prohibition against such reasoning. Blanchette also draws some useful distinctions between kinds of "universalism" and their significance for the coherence of metatheoretic reasoning. Frege is clearly a universalist in the weak sense that he believes his logic is applicable everywhere. It follows that logic would be applicable to metatheoretic reasoning as well and thus that such reasoning cannot provide a non-circular justification of the laws of logic. But as Blanchette observes, most metatheoretic work does not aspire to any such justification anyway. A far stronger form of universalism is the view that "logical inferences can only be scientifically justified by appeal to the rules of [Frege's] formal system" (p. 165). Blanchette observes that this view would threaten many forms of metatheoretic reasoning; for instance, it would render any argument for the reliability of the rules of Frege's system viciously circular. However, she denies that Frege endorsed this strong univeralism, partly on the grounds that he accepted that earlier mathematical reasoning could produce justification (albeit not always the optimal one).

Some other important questions concerning Frege's conception of logic receive little or no attention in the book. How did Frege demarcate logic from other kinds of knowledge? How are logical justification and knowledge to be understood? Why, exactly, are logical truths analytic (in a sense that is close enough to Kant's to acquit Frege of the charge that he has simply changed the subject)? The relative silence on these questions is a bit disappointing for readers interested in the prospects for reviving some form of Fregean logicism.

This book is a valuable addition to the large literature on Frege and is warmly recommended to anyone interested in this great pioneer or his philosophy of mathematics.