French Philosophy Today: New Figures of the Human in Badiou, Meillassoux, Malabou, Serres and Latour

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Christopher Watkin, French Philosophy Today: New Figures of the Human in Badiou, Meillassoux, Malabou, Serres and Latour, Edinburgh University Press, 2016, 258pp., $93.90 (hbk), ISBN 9781474414739.

Reviewed by Burhanuddin Baki, Universiti Sains Malaysia


Christopher Watkin's book is devoted to understanding and exploring two particular questions, each forming its own knotted cluster of problems and dilemmas.

The first question concerns the definition of the human. What is the human, and what are its essential properties? How might one go about constructing such a definition or formulating those essential properties? These are all central and ancient problems, dating back to early philosophical thinking. In his Introduction, Watkin catalogues the various invocations and reformulations of these issues in the history of thought. Certainly anyone who is interested in understanding the philosophical question of the human essence can do well by reading his book.

The second question involves characterizing the present state of French philosophy. What are the current and central trajectories of French thought today, particularly following the culmination of the so-called linguistic turn and what we continue to call post-structuralism? It is impossible to deny that French thinking in the post-war period has been a source of important philosophical production. If Alain Badiou, the first French thinker analyzed in the book, is to be believed, then philosophers are his country's greatest export. Certainly those who want to keep abreast about what is happening in France today in regards to this export should pick up Watkin's book.

As indicated by its title, Watkin's book seeks to tackle both questions together and through each other. He examines and assesses the ways of rethinking the figure of the human in the works of five living French philosophers: Badiou, Quentin Meillassoux, Catherine Malabou, Michel Serres and Bruno Latour. In addition to the Introduction and Conclusion, the book contains six chapters, devoted to Badiou, Meillassoux, Serres and Latour, and (two chapters) to Malabou. As Watkin points out, his book can be seen as continuing a series of recent publications by other continental philosophical scholars that try to map and highlight recent trends in French thought. Those publications have concentrated on explicating the three closely-connected themes of materialism, realism and immanence in recent French thought. By focusing on the figure of the human and the philosophical explorations of that figure by the five philosophers, Watkin identifies a different philosophical trajectory that serves not as a counter-theme but a supplement to the ones given by previous commentators.

All this does not mean that the audience to his book should be limited to those who are interested in contemporary French philosophy and the question of the human. This book is relevant to anyone who is interested in the scholarly methodology and creative enterprise of syntopically reading multiple philosophical oeuvres together. Watkin's bibliographic thoroughness and analytic meticulousness is impressive. It appears that he has read almost anything of relevance to the topic. The texts he references include not just philosophical works from various eras, schools and geographies but also works from theology, the humanities, social science, natural sciences and mathematics. He does not shy away from quoting Christian theological texts, such as by Thomas Aquinas and Gregory of Nyssa, and also highly technical research papers in neuroscience, for instance Jean-Pierre Changeux and Gerald M. Edelman on the neuronal models of cognitive functions. I should also note that a large proportion of those texts have yet to be translated into English, and therefore Watkin's book contains some of the first critical study of them in any language.

Watkin's formulations are rigorous and precise. Through his careful reading and evaluation of the texts by the five French philosophers, Watkin introduces an arsenal of new conceptual technologies and divisional schemas for understanding the question of the human. Gilles Deleuze and FĂ©lix Guattari's famously defined philosophical production as concept creation. If they are correct, then Watkin's work is not just a scholarly commentary of philosophy but also itself an inventive philosophical work.

Chief among these novel conceptual technologies, and the one that supplies the overarching structure governing his syntopical reading, is Watkin's idea of a "host" or a "host property", which he borrows with creative modification from John E. Coons and Patrick M. Brennan. A property is designated a host with respect to a given account of the human if it is the "gatekeeper" of human distinctiveness, if it is that without which there is no adequate conception of humanity. Watkin provides a taxonomy of the various tendencies in the history of Western thought in the usage of the epithets homo, animal, zoon and their various cognates in other languages seeking to embody the essence of the human. With the aid of this taxonomy, Watkin observes three tendencies in the identification of a locus humanus. A host can be a "host capacity", a "host substance" or a "host relation" (later, in some of his analyses of Serres and Latour, Watkin adds "host narrative" to supplement and specify further a type of "host relation"). This threefold taxonomy acts as the cognitive tool to understand the figure of the human in the five French philosophers. Watkin does, however, note that this divisional scheme is both a "bad master" and a "good servant". His application of the schema does not imply that he is approaching the philosophers with some ready-made metaphysics. Several times, and in several sections throughout his book, he complicates and deconstructs the background assumptions behind the tripartite schema.

Broadly speaking, Watkin aligns Badiou and Meillassoux with the tendency to identify host capacities for the human. He sees Malabou identifying a host substance; while both Serres and Latour identify multi-modal host narratives or relations. For each philosopher, Watkin's analyzes, discusses and evaluates his or her understanding of the human and also attempts to extend or relate that understanding to other relevant philosophers, particularly in his reading of Malabou, where he connects her work with Paul Ricoeur's theories of metaphor and meaning.

According to Watkin, the distinguishing feature of the human in Badiou's philosophy of "formalized inhumanism" is its host capacity for affirmative thought instigated by a fidelity to a truth. The human becomes itself by rising above its animal nature and constitutively pursuing the irreducible inhuman supplement of thought following the rupture of an event. However, according to Watkin, it is not clear how a human animal becomes capable of thought. Moreover, this host capacity can be too limiting. For example, it excludes an account of the most vulnerable humans, such as babies, the senile, and people with severe mental disabilities. These complaints also hold for Meillassoux's philosophy which, despite the French philosopher's rejection of Kantian correlationist anthropomorphism, similarly recognizes the human in terms of the host capacity to think the eternal absolute.

The two chapters on Malabou explicate and expand on her account of the human as given in her philosophical study of brain neuroplasticity and epigenetic identity. For Watkin's Malabou, the human takes as its host substance the cerebral matter of the brain in its essential plasticity. Her theory of epigenetic self and identity understands the human as that which is formed ecologically in the relations of tension, process, and dispossession between the biological and the cultural. Breaking the nature-culture divide, the self is neither wholly material nor hermeneutical. One benefit of Malabou's theory is that for her humanity is universal, material, monist and immanent to itself. All these features enable her account of the human to evade some of the previous issues with host capacities found in Badiou and Meillassoux. However, this might just be a partial side-stepping of those issues, and Watkin wonders whether plasticity can just be a host capacity or host meta-capacity in disguise.

The turn towards a host relational theory begins with Watkin's study of Serres, who understands humanity as part of the "Great Story" of the universe, starting from the birth of the cosmos up to the grand works and discoveries by humans in science, art and culture. When understood in terms of the host narrative of the universe, this new figure of the human inhabits more than one mode and is able to accommodate both its singular determinacy and generic plurality. But this Great Story can also be restrictive. In another inventive use of conceptual technology, Watkin argues that Serres' host narrative can account for the human only "extensively", but not "exhaustively". There is nothing about and within the human that Serres's Great Story cannot describe in its own terms, but this does not imply that is has exhausted everything essential about humanity. For Watkin this limitation is rectified in Latour's theory of the human as an amalgam of multiple modes of existence. In Latour's analysis, the human is not restricted to a single host narrative or a single mode. It cannot be adequately covered by one mode individually, as a mode can only extensively, not exhaustively, cover the human. Of all the five philosophers, Latour's account of the human as a "polyphonic composition" is the one Watkin finds most satisfactory.

How to proceed from Watkin's work? The obvious route would be to pursue adjacent, supplementary or complementary topics, such as other themes and trajectories besides the human, or other philosophers besides the five chosen by Watkin. Among those are philosophers who were taught or influenced by Badiou, Meillassoux, Malabou, Serres and Latour -- or who are reacting against them, either positively or negatively. This includes the younger cohorts, particularly those who belong to various off-shoots of what we still call "Speculative Realism", who have their feet in both the continental and analytic traditions.

For my part, I am particularly interested not just in the various definitions of humanity, but also in the meta-definitions and in the very philosophical process and act of producing definitions. This becomes more complex for cases, like the human, that present an exigency to construct some intelligible point that is in equilibrium between determinacy and de-differentiation, between stability and multiplicity. Or perhaps the exigency would be to diagonalize through this dichotomy between openness and closure. But how? What new structures of philosophical language, what new conceptual technologies, what "engines of analysis", would be adequate for all these? And what would be the decision procedure for resolving whether a particular engine of analysis would suffice? In his methodological approach, and in the meticulous manner which he thinks through the profound dilemmas of capacity, absolute thought, epigenesis, plasticity, multi-modality, and so on, certainly Watkin's book has a lot to offer.