Freud as Philosopher: Metapsychology after Lacan

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Boothby, Richard, Freud as Philosopher: Metapsychology after Lacan, Routledge, 2001, 330 pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-415-92590-8.

Reviewed by Elliot L. Jurist, CUNY


The overzealousness of Lacanians can be off-putting—as if Freud was rescued for posterity’s sake by Lacan’s radical interpretation of his thought. Yet, those who revile Lacanians can be equally excessive—as if Lacan was merely an intellectual poseur whose bad behavior as a clinician is the main thing that one needs to know about him. Needless to say, a philosophical study that avoids these extremes and that aims to gain some clarity about Lacan as a thinker would be as welcome as it would be desirable. Richard Boothby’s Freud as Philosopher: Metapsychology After Lacan aspires to be such a study. Although it is not fully successful, Boothby does deserve credit for making Lacan more accessible and helping non-Lacanians to appreciate his philosophical contribution.

Let me begin with a word about the title of this book: it is rather misleading, and the author virtually concedes as much in his Conclusion. It is a peculiar title because the book is organized around Lacan, and to a lesser extent, Lacan’s relationship to Freud. Freud is considered exclusively through a Lacanian lens, and no serious attention is given to other perspectives on Freud. Indeed, the subtitle gives a much better indication of the nature of the book’s content. Boothby wants to defend the value of metapsychology, arguing that such concepts as “psychic energy” and the “death drive” are powerful metaphors that should not be dismissed.

The issue of metapsychology is ripe for revisiting. Although it was a hot topic within psychoanalysis in the 70’s, it has become less pressing but remains controversial and divisive. For some, who view psychoanalysis as a science, metapsychology is a painful reminder of the pseudo-scientific tendencies that are part of the legacy of psychoanalysis. For others, clinical experience ought to be the basis of theory-making, and so there is no place for the speculative language of metapsychology. The complicated question of what concepts to abandon and which to preserve has never been adequately addressed in psychoanalysis. As is well known, the death instinct is the one concept introduced by Freud that was resisted in his lifetime; however, it has continued to have proponents and recently has been reinterpreted and redeemed by Jonathan Lear.

Central to Boothby’s argument is that Lacan brought psychoanalysis into contact with philosophy; in particular, phenomenology, existentialism, structuralism, linguistics and anthropology. Boothby intends to deepen the contact between psychoanalysis and philosophy by focusing on the theory of meaning. His opening chapter develops the notion of a “dispositional field” through a fruitful exploration of a wide range of theorists—Monet, William James, Bergson, Nietzsche, Gestalt psychologists, Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. Following Merleau-Ponty, Boothby believes that the structure of thought can be discerned in the study of the perceptual field, and that thought itself has an inherently dialectical quality of being both determinate and indeterminate. Boothby then claims that psychoanalysis is a science of the dispositional field: the mind is understood as having the character of being a field, and so whatever figure garners our (conscious) attention must be juxtaposed against the (unconscious) ground (p. 65). At this juncture, Boothby’s interpretation of psychoanalysis relies heavily on parallels with phenomenology, although he readily acknowledges points of divergence (as with the concept of repression).

In the second chapter, Boothby focuses on the implications of the distinction between images and words in psychoanalysis. He explicates the distinction in Lacanian terms—between the imaginary (images) and the symbolic (words)—and endorses the notion that linguistics is the key to understanding the unconscious (as opposed to phenomenology). Lacan’s terminology is related to the dispositional field in that the imaginary is a “focal cathexis by which a perceptual figure is disembedded from a background and held before consciousness” and the symbolic is a “diffuse cathexis” which is discerned in how “the meaning of linguistic signs is imbricated within a broad system of other signs and associations that remain the unconscious possession of every speaker” (p. 87). Boothby elaborates on the symbolic by reference to Saussure and Jakobson. He then introduces Lacan’s interpretation of Freud’s famous Irma dream in which the dream is understood as being not just about sexuality, but about the theory of dreams itself. This discussion affords Boothby an opportunity to showcase the power of Lacan’s concept of the symbolic.

The next stage of the argument, in the third chapter, addresses the importance of “alienation” to Lacan, which leads to a discussion of his concept of the ego, and ultimately the concept of the real, the third of the triad that begins with the imaginary and the symbolic. Boothby is right, I think, to emphasize how pervasive the theme of alienation is in all of Lacan’s writing. From a Lacanian point of view, there is necessarily a gap in the human subject. Put in different terms, Lacan asserts that the ego and the subject are opposed to each other. Lacan’s take on the ego, according to Boothby, is that it is “a fundamental restriction, a kind of bottleneck, in the impulse life of the organism” (p. 144). Boothby seems to assimilate this claim without qualms and without reflecting on its validity as an interpretation of Freud. He moves on to introduce Lacan’s related and even more sweeping assertion that the paradigm of desire, which defines the human subject, is the desire for death, an affirmation of the death drive (p. 151). In retrospect, it seems apparent that Lacan’s view must have been strongly influenced by the contextual background of World War II. Although Freud introduced the concept of the death drive in the wake of World War I and, on the eve of World War II, openly worried about the prospect of thanatos dominating eros, it is highly questionable whether he would have warmed to Lacan’s emendation of his thought. The Freudian psyche is characterized by irreducible tensions—between thanatos and eros and between the ego and the id. Lacan is right that the ego psychologists flatten the rough edges of psychoanalysis by downplaying the role of the id and overlooking thanatos. Yet, Lacan valorizes the limitations of the ego and underestimates Freud’s commitment to the possibility of an integrated psyche. It is illuminating to compare Lacan to Hans Loewald who claims that eros, rather than thanatos, is the truly radical concept in Freud, since it is the source for the possibility of attaining new levels of intrapsychic integration.

Boothby’s discussion of the Lacanian concept of the real is insightful. The real is defined as a force that remains unknowable to itself. How is it possible to describe our knowledge of something that is unknowable? Boothby’s suggestion is that a close counterpart to the Lacanian idea of the real is found in Heidegger’s understanding of the role of the Nothing in his critique of metaphysics. We come into contact with the real/the Nothing, Boothby avers, through the experience of anxiety.

Reflection on the real is continued in the next chapter, on another Lacanian concept, “the Thing,” which is regarded as the locus of unrepresentability. The Thing is particularly intertwined with the use of language: language brings to mind what is absent, and, in fact, allows the speaker to glimpse that something is essentially missing (p. 217). For Boothby, we can grapple with the Thing by examining the phoneme, precisely because it is a combination of both sound and meaning. Added to this in the fifth and last chapter is an examination of the object a, Lacan’s concept which designates the intersection between word and image, a part of the dispositional realm can never come to our attention. Given that the object a is resistant to symbolization, it can be discerned only through its effects. Like the real, the concept is meant to invoke mystery: “The object a is at once impossible to possess and impossible to live without” (p. 244). Boothby puts Greimas’ semiotic square to use in operationalizing Lacan’s overall theory.

By this juncture in the book, I must confess that as a reader I began to feel weighed down by the force of the multiplying Lacanian assumptions. It is hard to know what to make of the idea of the unrepresentable, that is, how such non-mentalized meaning can exist. Clearly, Lacan wants to capture something beyond the experience of trying to say what one means and not being able to do so. He comes perilously close to supposing that saying what one means must be an illusion. However rare, it seems possible to have moments of emotional insight in which one comes to know (and say) what one thought one did not know. Indeed, I take it to be a primary aim of psychoanalytic treatment to cultivate such moments. The Lacanian formulation of psychoanalysis as the repunctuation of the patient’s discourse, which Boothby mentions, obscures the challenging task for both patient and analyst of seeking, losing, finding, and staying with what matters most in the patient’s emotional life. André Green’s criticism of Lacanian psychoanalysis for ignoring the importance of affects is confirmed here.

Boothby’s project begins with the aspiration of making Lacan come alive as a thinker; however, as the book unfolds, he ends up lauding Lacan in the spirit of a true believer. His conclusion postulates, for example, that Lacan’s relation to Freud has a “singular character,” and that it “is perhaps unique in the history of thought” (p. 280). Happily, the opening chapters of the book are written without such hyperbole. After all, there is no good reason to ignore other interpretations of Freud in order to establish the profundity of Lacan. In this connection, I found it particularly disappointing that Boothby’s discussion of Lacan’s developmental views fails to contend with more contemporary developmental ideas concerning mirroring and the unfolding of language. My point is neither that Lacan is right nor that he is wrong; it is merely that if there is research that bears on his theory, it is fair to expect it to receive some attention.

In insisting that a disparity exists and cannot be overcome between who we are and what we would like to be, Lacan offers a hard-nosed extension of Freud. Lacan also provides an important new perspective on symbolization, which has emerged to be a central theme these days in psychoanalysis. Moreover, Lacan’s emphasis on the failure of symbolization is noteworthy, as he depicts it as a universal and inevitable experience rather than as a product of trauma. For Lacan, the failure of symbolization is fundamental to the experience of being human—hence, his concern with the real, the Thing, and object a.

Lacan heralds the post-modern subject and thus offers a vision of psychoanalysis that continues to be relevant. However, there is an ontologizing tendency in Lacan—which Boothby does not confront—that is not easy to accept. Boothby is too complacent in his presentation of Lacan’s speculative and often gnomic solutions to genuinely puzzling problems. This is a book, therefore, that is likely to be most exciting for readers who are already partial to Lacan. Yet, Boothby’s book will be useful for anyone who has interests in the intersection between philosophy and psychoanalysis.