Friedrich Nietzsche: A Philosophical Biography

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Julian Young, Friedrich Nietzsche: A Philosophical Biography, Cambridge UP, 2010, 649pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521871174.

Reviewed by Charlie Huenemann, Utah State University



Simply put, this is an excellent biography of Nietzsche, and a model of what a philosophical biography should be. Young offers a smooth integration of biographical detail and philosophical analysis so that one can readily see how Nietzsche’s life and thought informed one another. He stakes out some controversial interpretive claims, but even setting these aside, Young has produced a study that must be read by every Nietzsche scholar and by anyone interested more generally in the shaping of the modern philosophical landscape.

Among other Nietzsche biographies available in English, Young’s biography improves hugely upon Safranski (2002) and Hollingdale (1965), and sizably upon both Kaufmann (1950) and Hayman (1980) in scope and detail. It is a difficult balance to achieve, but Young has a keen sense of exactly how much detail to relate without becoming tedious and tiresome. He vividly describes the particulars of Nietzsche’s very real “living concerns” — his fragile health, his financial limits, his changing relations with family and friends, and his constant quest to find the atmospheric conditions for his work — without reducing Nietzsche’s thoughts to these concerns. Young preserves this balance by alternating between sections of mainly biographical material and sections with more substantive philosophical analysis. He usefully enlists a wide array of materials, from Nietzsche’s notebooks to the correspondence of his various acquaintances (both with Nietzsche and with one another) in order to illuminate Nietzsche’s life and thought.

And so we are provided with helpful accounts of the relevant historical and political circumstances, including the events of the Franco-Prussian war, Bismarck’s rise to power, and the growth of Bayreuth and the Wagner industry. At the same time, we are given stimulating and informed philosophical discussions of Hölderlin, Schopenhauer, and (once again) Wagner. All of these discussions combine to provide a rich sense of Nietzsche’s circumstances — social, historical, and intellectual. As an example of one of the revealing historical insights Young provides, consider his discussion of Nietzsche’s relation to the “Life-Reform Movement” (Lebensreform Bewegung) in Germany. This movement was expressed in many forms, but its adherents generally seem to have promoted a new generation of “free spirits,” a return to nature, freedom from the entrapments of industrial civil society, new forms of spirituality, and formations of communes. They were basically 19th-century hippies, as Young notes, and though it would certainly be a mistake to categorize Nietzsche as just another hippie, it is nevertheless instructive to view Nietzsche’s own discussions of free spirits, along with his many plans for forming philosophical communes and his dietary advice, against the backdrop of this larger social movement. In so viewing him, he becomes less of a lone voice in the wilderness and more of a very distinctive voice in a chorus demanding cultural reform.

It is furthermore to Young’s great credit that he devotes ample insight and space to the importance of music to Nietzsche. Cambridge UP has made Nietzsche’s own music available on the web, and Young frequently alludes to various pieces, explains their significance, and reviews how they were received by various parties. It should be recognized that Nietzsche’s music has received an undeservedly bad rap — some notable musicians, such as Lizst, quite liked it. Young also sensibly and sensitively treats at length Nietzsche’s changing attitudes towards women, both toward the women he knew personally and toward the whole “species,” as Nietzsche might have put it. Basically, it ends up looking like Nietzsche ranked as something of a 19th-century feminist until Lou Salome jilted him, and then he turned toward misogyny in varying strengths.

When it comes to the philosophical analysis of Nietzsche’s thought, Young’s book is also instructive, and his close detective work integrating letters and notebooks with Nietzsche’s published works leads to several intriguing and compelling observations. So, for instance, Young sorts out passages that lend themselves toward a “postmodern” reading of Nietzsche (which holds, basically, that since “reality” itself arises out of discourse, all interpretations of “it” are equal) and carefully compares them to companion notebook entries and other discussions with an eye toward a realist view that Nietzsche also voiced, namely: that many different interpretations of a genuinely real world may be said to be equally valid, with respect to our needs or concerns at a given time (a “pluralist” reading). It is a hard interpretive call to make, given the mercurial nature of some of the texts, and Nietzsche may have slid back and forth between the two views, but in the end Young makes a compelling case for taking the pluralist reading as predominant. “Reality,” as he suggests on Nietzsche’s behalf,

is multi-aspected. Some perspectives (not all, of course) genuinely reveal aspects of reality. The more genuine perspectives one has command of, the more ‘knowledgeable’ one is, the closer one comes to the — unattainable but inspiring — goal of ‘completing science’ (475-6).

(The same could be said of the goal of ‘completing an understanding of Nietzsche’s thought,’ come to think of it.)

But there are three distinctive interpretive claims Young makes that are sure to invite challenges from the specialists. (The first two claims will be familiar to those who have already read Young’s Nietzsche’s Philosophy of Religion.) The first is that an overarching aim of Nietzsche’s philosophy is to provide “a new religious outlook to re-found culture” (181, my emphasis). This may seem a wholly implausible claim to make on behalf of the man who wrote “God is dead” and was the author of the Antichrist. But what is meant by “religious”? If we suppose that what Young means is not much more than having a certain reverential attitude toward, well, something, then the claim is quite plausible. For Nietzsche certainly had that: he revered many things, including life, nobility, health, hardness, strength, and cultural achievement. And there certainly is a religious fervor permeating Zarathustra as well as Nietzsche’s other passionate texts. So, to the extent that Young means only to say that Nietzsche had a kinda religiousy outlook upon what he understood as virtues, he is surely right. But in fact Young often means more than just this. He thinks Nietzsche maintains that the “higher men” will need to raise up divine beings, at least as heuristics to guide their efforts and orient their post-Christian society, and he comes awfully close to claiming that Nietzsche proposes a return to Greek polytheism (518). That is a bit much. Surely, one thinks, we can draw some distinction between the sort of “life-attitude” Nietzsche advocates and a temperament that is more properly understood as religious — a distinction arising perhaps from the icy intellect Nietzsche thinks one must have in order to see things properly. It is hard to imagine returning to our idols, even as heuristics, once we have seen through them.

The second controversial interpretive claim is that Nietzsche, far from trying to demolish traditional morality, was out to “re-found” the sorts of values we might today identify with communitarianism. Young returns to this claim frequently throughout his book, and it must be said that he gathers up surprisingly good evidence for it. Nietzsche did see himself as a “good European,” and consistently despised the growing German Reich, so it is no stretch to see his overall concerns as cosmopolitan. But in the end, on Young’s reading, when we find out that Nietzsche wants a society infused with compassion and high culture, and that he might look favorably upon one that finds its unity in a shared effort to combat global warming (! – 479), one is left wondering whether Nietzsche has been tamed into something more familiar and friendly to our own moral sensibilities. Indeed, why would Nietzsche prophesy that someday his name would be associated with "something frightful — of a crisis like no other on earth, of the profoundest collision of conscience, of a decision evoked against everything that until then had been believed in, demanded, sanctified" — if in the end all he wanted to establish was that we as a community need to care more about one another and about higher culture? Young writes, thinking of Zarathustra, “For the ideal leader, indeed for any truly healthy person, the prosperity of the community (of humanity) as a whole is the defining meaning of their lives. For the healthy person, personal meaning is communal meaning” (516). But this would mean that very little of Young’s Nietzsche would present much of a challenge to any contemporary liberal, which should alert us to the possibility that something important has gone missing. When Nietzsche urged that we move beyond good and evil, did he really just mean trading in the Ten Commandments for the Green Party?

The third controversial claim is that, by the end of his life, Nietzsche had repudiated the “will to power” doctrine, or at least had backed off it so that it was only a claim about the value of health to bring happiness to a human life. This brings us to a fine example of Young’s sleuthing through texts. The short version of Young’s careful account (over 536-549) is that Nietzsche started working on a sizable, definitive work entitled The Will to Power in 1885. It was to be his theory of everything. And so we find, in notes and publications continuing through 1888, many attempts to advance the will to power as a metaphysical doctrine. But in letters to his friends Nietzsche began to confess that the project was not coming together as he had hoped, and indeed "had gone down the plug hole [ins Wasser gefallen]." Some of his materials were repackaged into what became Twilight of the Idols, and other materials were designated for a new multi-volume work, the Revaluation of All Values. According to Young’s account, the change in strategy resulted principally from Nietzsche (a) recognizing that the will to power doctrine, in its most sweeping, metaphysical guise, was simply implausible, as well as (b) coming to conclude that the overly systematic nature of the enterprise was in conflict with his own philosophical temperament. Vestiges of the will to power doctrine remain in Nietzsche’s mature account of what constitutes a healthy psychology, Young maintains, but the big systematic metaphysics finally disappears from his horizon. I find Young’s arguments for this claim compelling (though I do not fully agree with his account of Nietzschean health).

A reviewer for the New York Times complained that Young’s book is marred by frequent references to pop culture and recent politics. Indeed one will find scattered mention of the Iraq war, iPhones, and Second Life avatars. This is mainly only a matter of taste (dry classicism vs. juicy immanence), but one serious danger with being “too timely” is that one might misread one’s own times, or become swept up in them. Thus the reader is surprised to come across someone who has reduced his carbon footprint by knitting sweaters and relying on windmills used as an example of a latter-day Nietzschean argonaut; he is equally surprised by the speculation that Nietzsche would have been buoyed by U.S. President Barack Obama’s potential for providing “spiritual leadership with global power” (333n). There also are a couple of simply bizarre tangential observations, such as that Robert Mugabe’s violence perpetrated on his own people is somehow related to his own good health, and that the “stench” of the Nazis is still present in the Nietzsche Archive house in Weimar. These invite some head scratching, to be sure.

But enough carping over minor infelicities. I stand by my earlier claim that this is the very model of a philosophical biography. Indeed, Young’s work will be the principal biographical reference for this and the next generation of Nietzsche scholars. After that, of course, we scholars will need to tell the story all over again to ourselves. Eternal return of the same, you know?1

1 I would like to thank Michael Drake, Mike Howsden, and Rob Sica for comments on this review.