From a Deflationary Point of View

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Paul Horwich, From a Deflationary Point of View, Oxford University Press, 2005, 184pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199251266.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Ketland, University of Edinburgh


Horwich's new book brings together ten articles, previously published over the period 1982-2004. These articles cover a diverse body of topics: truth, meaning, realism, scientific theory choice, norms, art and meta-philosophy. Binding the articles together is a central theme -- deflationism -- and hence the book's title. As Horwich states in the introduction, these reprinted essays "represent some of my efforts to develop and implement the deflationary outlook and they make a good case, I believe, for its power and fertility" (p. 1).

As normally understood, the term 'deflationism' denotes a collection of views concerning the notion of truth. Such views aim to deflate more substantial or robust views about truth, such as the correspondence conception, the semantic conception, and various epistemic conceptions (the coherence theory, verificationism, and pragmatism). The deflationary conception begins from the appreciation that any analysis of the notion of truth must be constrained by some version of the T-scheme: the equivalence of A and "A is true". In itself, this demand is not deflationary. Rather, it is, as Tarski noted in Der Wahrheitsbegriff, an adequacy condition on a proposed truth definition (and indeed this constraint requires careful formulation so as to avoid inconsistency). Rather, the deflationary thesis is that there is nothing more to the notion of truth than what is stated by the T-scheme. From this aperçu, a variety of deflationary conclusions are drawn, such as:

-- truth is not a property;

-- the notion of truth is implicitly defined by the T-scheme;

-- a truth predicate is merely a "device of disquotation";

-- a truth predicate is a device of indirect endorsement;

-- the raison d'être of a truth predicate is to permit the re-expression of possibly infinite sets of statements as a single statement.

Deflationism is the main theme of the first, second, and fourth essays, "Three Forms of Realism" (1982), "Realism and Truth" (1996), and "Meaning, Use and Truth" (1995). I shall return to this group of essays at the end.

The third and fifth essays, "How to Choose Between Empirically Distinguishable Theories" (1982) and "The Nature and Norms of Theoretical Commitment" (1991), discuss the topic of scientific theory choice. The former essay develops a position Horwich calls Global Conventionalism (a position similar to what is known as Conceptual Role Semantics). Horwich analyses the notion of the conceptual role of a theoretical predicate via the theory's Ramsey sentence (after the logician Frank Ramsey; converting a theory formulation to its Ramsey sentence is sometimes called ramsification). I found Horwich's line of argument here somewhat hard to follow, but it seems to be that the correct representation of the content of a scientific theory T is given by its Ramsey sentence R(T). In particular, Horwich argues that the conditional R(T) → T, which measures what Popperians called the "excess content" of T over R(T), is "known a priori":

Our fundamental thesis is that, if S1 is our total theory-formulation, then we know a priori that, if a Ramsey sentence derived from S1 is true, then S1 is true -- that is,

(1¢) R(S1) → S1 (p. 60)

Proposals to analyse theoretical content in terms of Ramsey sentences have a long history (Ramsey, Carnap, Maxwell, Lewis and others), and have been advanced by several recent "structural realists", such as Worrall, Zahar, and Redhead. In my view, the major problem with any such conceptual-role view of the semantics of theoretical terms is the "Newman Problem", identified by M.H.A. Newman in a 1928 Mind review of Russell's Analysis of Matter (1927), where Russell had presented a structuralist account of knowledge claims. Structural knowledge claims are Ramsey sentences. That is, they have the form "there are relations R1, …, Rn on the domain D such that φ(R1, …, Rn) holds". Newman criticized this view on the grounds that such structural knowledge claims about the external world are, if satisfiable at all, mathematically equivalent to claims about the cardinality of the domain D. More generally, if only theoretical predicates are ramsified and the second-order quantifiers are given their standard semantics, then it can be shown that the truth of a Ramsey sentence R(T) is equivalent to T's possessing an empirically correct model of the right size (see William Demopoulos, "On the Rational Reconstruction of our Theoretical Knowledge" (2003) and Jeffrey Ketland, "Empirical Adequacy and Ramsification" (2004), both in British Journal for the Philosophy of Science). Thus someone who asserts R(T) is asserting little more than that the theory T is empirically adequate (its observational consequences are all true). So, Horwich's view collapses to an instrumentalist view of theory acceptance, similar to van Fraassen's. Ironically, this is precisely what Horwich intends to avoid.

Of course, if the truth of R(T) is tantamount to T's empirical adequacy, and truth goes beyond empirical adequacy (as it surely does), then the conditional R(T) → T cannot be known a priori, as Horwich claims.

There is more work to be done clarifying this matter. The most obvious proposal insists that second-order variables appearing in Ramsey sentences must be taken to range over only some special collection of real properties and relations. Of course, this requires an independent explanation of what distinguishes these "real" relations from the "artificial" ones.

The fifth essay, "The Nature and Norms of Theoretical Commitment" (1991), is an interesting argument against scientific instrumentalism, van Fraassen-style. The instrumentalist insists upon a distinction between accepting a theory and believing it. If a theory has the appropriate epistemic credentials, the instrumentalist recommends only acceptance, while demurring from belief. Bas van Fraassen in The Scientific Image (1980) argued that observable empirical support can only ever warrant acceptance of a theory (i.e., believing it to be empirically correct), but can never warrant believing the theory (i.e., believing it to be true). Most realists accept the distinction in some form or another, but argue that belief in a theory's approximate truth is often justified (usually by a no-miracles argument of some sort). Horwich's aim in his essay is to argue that the very distinction between belief and acceptance cannot be maintained: "believing a theory is nothing over and above the mental state responsible for using it; and so the attitude urged by instrumentalism is impossible" (p. 87).

According to van Fraassen's characterization of the instrumentalist's posture, acceptance consists in believing just the observable consequences of a theory (including those observation statements that derive from the theory in conjunction with other accepted theories), and using the theory to make predictions, give explanations (without being committed to their truth), and design experiments. No wonder Vaihinger called this the philosophy of 'as if'. For these are precisely the things that a believer would do. Yet it is suggested that we might accept our theories without believing them! This is a distinction without a difference (pp. 88-89).

For good or ill, there is a whiff of behaviourism about this argument. Horwich goes on to argue that a psychological theory would characterise beliefs "as states with a particular causal role" which would "consist in such features as generating predictions, prompting certain utterances, being caused by certain observations, entering in characteristic ways into inferential relations …" and concludes "but that is to define belief in exactly the way instrumentalists characterise acceptance" (p. 89).

This is an empirical indistinguishability argument: belief and acceptance are behaviourally indistinguishable. This may be true, but it does not establish the identity of belief and acceptance unless one adds the behaviourist premise that beliefs should be defined in terms of behaviour. So, I am not sure that Horwich makes a good case for identifying belief and acceptance. But I suspect that arguments like this lend credence to the conclusion that the boundary between acceptance and belief is fuzzier that those who urge instrumentalism would care to admit.

The sixth essay "Wittgensteinian Bayesianism" (1993) is a standard account of the Bayesian approach to epistemology and scientific method. The seventh essay "Deflating the Direction of Time" (1993) is a short review of J.R. Lucas, The Future (1987). Lucas there defended the common-sense idea of a moving NOW, which trichotomizes events into the absolute past, present, and future. Against this, Horwich defends a space-time block-universe view (Minkowski, Einstein, Russell, Carnap, Quine, Lewis and others). On this view, the spatio-temporal structure of the universe, represented in our best physical theories as a manifold with a metric, does not involve a special moving NOW; indeed, attempting to add such a feature faces severe problems. Horwich's article is well-argued, and makes a good case against the moving NOW view.

The eighth essay, "Gibbard's Theory of Norms" (1993), is a review of Alan Gibbard's Wise Choices, Apt Feelings: A Theory of Normative Judgement (1990). Horwich aims to blend his own deflationism with Gibbard's expressivism. Horwich argues that meta-normative questions concerning the factuality of normative claims can be deflated by insisting on the equivalence of "it is a fact that p" and "p". Horwich concludes that expressivists have no need to claim that normative assertions do not express facts, or are not true, or do not attribute properties:

Norm-expressivism has no need for these theses and would be better off without them. Its real substance lies in a distinctive semantic view of the indirect way in which the term 'rational' is defined (namely, that the meaning of 'rational' is specified implicitly by means of an explicit definition of 'Y believes that x is rational'), and a distinctive metaphysical claim about the non-explanatory nature of normative facts (namely, that beliefs about what is rational are not consequences of what is in fact rational). (p. 143).

I find little to recommend in all this. Presumably, the phenomenon of rationality is inseparable from truth-seeking, valid reasoning, and assigning probabilities coherently, in relation to evidence. It seems to me that the expressivist is changing the subject from the substantive issue of what constitutes rationality to analyses of linguistic phrases, such as 'Y believes that x is rational'.

In the ninth essay, "Science and Art" (2001), Horwich defends a form of aesthetic non-cognitivism which holds that are no norms relative to which one might correctly judge art to have progressed: "aesthetic value is attributed on the basis of aesthetic pleasure; but what will produce that desired effect varies enormously across individuals, times, and cultures" and "there is no established context-independent norm by which the correctness of such choices may be settled" (p. 158). De gustibus non est disputandum. This emotivist view is suitably deflationary. I am not quite sure what "aesthetic pleasure" is. Might one not appreciate a piece of art which does not produce a sense of aesthetic pleasure? How is aesthetic pleasure to be distinguished from other kinds of pleasure? Do chimpanzees experience aesthetic pleasure?

In the final essay, "Wittgenstein's Meta-Philosophical Development" (2004), Horwich begins by discussing the inconsistency between Wittgenstein's various aphorisms enunciated throughout the Tractatus and the final self-refuting aphorism, at Tractatus 6.54, where Wittgenstein says that his propositions are "elucidatory", and that he who understands them "finally recognizes them as senseless". There is a scholarly debate concerning the relationship between Wittgenstein's early and later works. A view that appears to be gaining currency is some sort of Continuity Thesis, of which Horwich advocates a version:

[H]is meta-philosophy is what is central and revolutionary. It does change somewhat -- an incoherent element is removed from it … [B]ut the correction in his core meta-philosophical position is small in relation to all that is retained: namely that philosophical questioning is provoked by linguogenic confusion, that it should not be straightforwardly answered, and that it cannot yield philosophical knowledge. Thus the Tractatus and the Investigations represent improving expressions of one and the same hyper-deflationary insight. (p. 171).

As Wittgenstein exegesis, the Continuity Thesis is probably right. But what insight, I ask? "Insight" is a success word. I would argue, along with Russell, Turing, Gödel and Popper, that philosophical questioning does yield philosophical knowledge. For example, philosophical questioning has led to quite specific and important knowledge, concerning for example the nature of infinity, the nature of number, the nature of computation, the nature of formal systems and their properties of completeness and incompleteness, the properties of truth, the applicability of mathematics, the nature of liberal democracy (and its antithesis, totalitarianism), the notion of human rights, of law, and so on. In short, the relevant inquiries have led to a good deal of philosophical knowledge, concerning abstract, cosmological, ethical, and political topics. Horwich may be right in saying that Wittgenstein's outlook from early to late can be understood as "hyper-deflationary", but that provides us with even more reason for rejecting such an outlook.

I now return to the essays on realism and deflationism about truth. In the first essay, "Three Forms of Realism" (1982), Horwich provides a detailed analysis of a variety of different ways in which the doctrine of realism has been formulated. He first distinguishes epistemological, semantic, and metaphysical realism; sympathetic to the first two, he is keen to reject the latter. He discusses eight further formulations of realism: "external world formulation", "autonomy formulation", "inaccessibility formulation", "modal formulations", "correspondence formulation", "Tarskian formulation", "empirical formulation", "Dummett's meaning-theory formulation". This article is impressively clear and succinct. Tucked inside, we find a defence of the deflationary view of truth and a sympathetic account of the use-theory of meaning. The second and fourth essays are both admirable in their clarity. The second essay "Realism and Truth" (1996) defends the deflationary conception of truth, and argues that debates about truth are, properly understood, independent of debates about realism. Actually, Alfred Tarski made a similar point in his 1944 essay, "The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics". The fourth essay, "Meaning, Use and Truth" (1995), again defends deflationism, but also contains a detailed defence of the use-theory of meaning. I lack the space to examine the arguments given there in defence of that view.

I conclude with some remarks about Horwich's deflationism about truth. For twenty years or so, deflationism has been widely defended and widely criticised. Horwich's Truth (1990; 1998) contains a detailed and useful response to a variety of criticisms. I mention one further criticism. This was introduced recently by Stewart Shapiro ("Truth and Proof -- Through Thick and Thin" (1998), Journal of Philosophy) and myself ("Deflationism and Tarski's Paradise" (1999), Mind).

This criticism concerns the alleged (non-)explanatory role of the notion of truth. Several deflationists, Horwich included, have insisted that the notion of truth has no explanatory role. I take this to be the central claim of deflationism. Analysing this claim, Shapiro and I first argued that, on a deflationary view of truth, one's theory of truth should be conservative over non-semantical base theories. If a theory of truth is deflationary, one should not be able to deduce new results about the non-truth-theoretic domain by using one's truth theory. Second, Shapiro and I also argued that a reasonable further condition on a theory of truth is that it should explain reflective reasoning, which is (roughly) reasoning from a theory T to its soundness, "All theorems of T are true" (when T is a mathematical theory, such statements are called reflection principles).

However, Shapiro and I noted that Gödel's incompleteness results imply that these two conditions are inconsistent. Reflective truth theories are non-conservative; and thus reflective truth theories are non-deflationary. To illustrate, Shapiro and I considered a number of formalized truth theories, which are added to Peano Arithmetic (PA). The truth theory based on the unrestricted T-scheme, "A is true iff A", is inconsistent when added to PA in classical logic, for one obtains a liar sentence. So, the full disquotational truth theory is non-deflationary. If we restrict the T-scheme, so that the formula A does not contain the truth predicate, then adding this restricted principle to PA is indeed conservative. However, it is also non-reflective.

Finally, if we formulate the axioms of Tarski's theory of truth for arithmetic, and add them to PA, we obtain a much stronger theory, denoted Tr(PA) (see Solomon Feferman 1991, "Reflecting on Incompleteness", Journal of Symbolic Logic). This truth theory is reflective, as it proves the reflection principle "All theorems of PA are true". From this, it follows that Tr(PA) proves both Con(PA) and the Gödel sentence G. However, this means that Tr(PA) is non-conservative; and thus, non-deflationary.

In a nutshell, reflective truth theories are non-conservative. So, one cannot have both conservation and reflection. Given the mathematical incompatibility of conservation and reflection, a deflationist about truth is faced with two options. First, he may reject the conservation condition, which requires that a deflationary truth theory should be conservative. Second, he may drop the demand that a truth theory be reflective. There has, in fact, been some discussion of these possibilities in the subsequent literature. But it is unclear to me which of these options Horwich would take.