From an Ontological Point of View

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John Heil, From an Ontological Point of View, Oxford University Press, 2003. 284pp., $ 45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199259747.

Reviewed by Gary S. Rosenkrantz, University of North Carolina, Greensboro


Heil’s main positive thesis is that fundamental issues in the philosophy of mind can be best addressed by adopting an adequate ontology and a correct account of dispositions or causal powers. These fundamental issues include the nature of experience and consciousness. Heil motivates his arguments in terms of two leading ideas. The first of these is that ontology is inescapable and that contemporary philosophy of mind has been hampered due to an over-reliance on linguistic approaches that are insufficiently ontological. Heil makes a compelling case that progress in the philosophy of mind requires ontological seriousness. The second idea concerns the manifest incorrectness and negative influence of the Picture Theory of representation, roughly, the theory “that the character of reality can be ‘read off’ our linguistic representations of reality”, and accordingly, “that to every meaningful predicate there corresponds a property” (p. 6). Heil believes that although few philosophers today explicitly endorse the Picture Theory, its influence is widespread in ontology and the philosophy of mind.

Heil’s book is masterful, wide-ranging, and instructive. It is also tightly argued, insightful, and provocative. The book is written in an admirably clear analytic style and is extremely well organized (each of the twenty concise chapters is subdivided into short numbered sections). Another plus is that Heil relates his ideas to those of major historical figures, e.g., Plato, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume, and discusses as well the ideas of a full range of major contemporary philosophers, including D. M. Armstrong, David Chalmers, Donald Davidson, Frank Jackson Jaegwon Kim, Saul Kripke , E. J. Lowe, C. B. Martin, Colin McGinn, Hilary Putnam, and Sidney Shoemaker. I strongly recommend this book to anyone with a serious interest in ontology or the philosophy of mind.

Heil’s critique of the Picture Theory commits him to skepticism about hierarchies of properties of various sorts, for instance, hierarchies of higher-order properties, that is to say, properties of properties. Thus, for example, on the assumption that there are properties, Heil doubts that there is the higher-order property being a property. Yet, suppose we take ontology seriously, as Heil urges us to do. In that case, on the assumption that properties are real beings, the property, being a property, qualifies as an ontological category, that is, as one of the more basic divisions of real beings, a division that figures in a hierarchy of ontological categories. In such a hierarchy, being a property is subsumed by a more general, or more basic, higher-order property, for example, being an abstract entity, or alternatively, being a concrete entity. (Other candidates for such a higher-order property are being a universal, being a particular, necessarily existing being, and contingently existing being.) The degree to which an ontological category is general is directly proportional to the degree to which it is basic. For these reasons, I believe that there is a significant unresolved tension between Heil’s two leading ideas. Heil could have eased this tension by limiting his skepticism to hierarchies consisting of properties that are more specific than ontological categories. After all, Heil seems to be primarily concerned with these more specific properties, for example, painfulness, fragility, and redness.

Heil’s ontology, influenced by C. B. Martin, posits substances and modes. Substances (or objects) are entities in which modes inhere; modes (also known as tropes) are particularized ways objects are. Substances are basic entities; they are not bundles of modes. Primitive relationships of perfect resemblance and imperfect resemblance hold among modes. E.g., two particular sphericities perfectly resemble one another, whereas a particular scarlet and a particular magenta resemble one another only imperfectly. Heil criticizes and rejects Aristotelian and Platonic theories of universals, arguing that objects share a property if and only if perfectly resembling modes inhere in those objects. Finally, according to Heil’s identity theory of dispositions, the qualities of objects, e.g., sphericity, are identical with dispositions of those objects, for example, the power to roll, to leave a spherical impression in mud, etc. (Thus, natural laws are necessary, but the qualities that figure in natural laws have contingent existence.) According to this identity theory, the qualities and powers of objects are ontologically on a par.

Heil argues that his ontology undermines the belief in a hierarchy of levels of reality advocated by many contemporary anti-reductionist philosophers of mind. Thus, e.g., Heil rejects the notion that pain is a higher-level property, i.e., a property that is multiply realizable in physiologically dissimilar creatures such as humans, fishes, and extraterrestrials (and not to be confused with a higher-order property). This notion, encouraged by the Picture Theory, gives rise to seemingly intractable philosophical problems about the inter-level relations and causal status of pains. These problems do not arise if physiologically dissimilar creatures could not be in pain in virtue of sharing some property, but rather, could only be in pain in virtue of having imperfectly similar qualities. Heil draws a parallel conclusion about dispositions; micro-structurally dissimilar fragile objects, say, wine glasses and clay vases, do not share a higher-level multiply realizable property of fragility, instead, their fragilities are imperfectly similar.

Heil’s ontology grounds his strong defense of the token-token identity theory that every mental quality (or mode) of an object is identical with a neurological quality of that object. In Heil’s view, “we can accept levels of organization, levels of complexity, levels of description, and levels of explanation, without commitment to levels of reality in the sense embraced by many self-proclaimed anti-reductionist philosophers today. The upshot is a conception of the world that is ontologically, but not analytically, reductive” (p. 10).

Heil builds a powerful case for his central claims. Still, I have questions about some important matters of detail. I now turn to these details.

Truth.Given his critique of the Picture Theory, Heil doubts that abstract propositions are “intermediaries standing between the world and statements or assertions about the world” (p. 9). Yet, as he acknowledges, it is difficult to believe that for every way the world is, there is a concrete representation of its being that way (pp. 55, 72). Intuitively, though, for every way the world is, it is true that it is that way. E.g., it seems that if, at a time, t, three billion years ago, nothing concretely represents the Earth as existing, because, at t, there is no life on Earth, then, at t, it is nonetheless true that the Earth exists at t. So, it seems that for every way the world is, there is an abstract representation, that is to say, a proposition, about its being that way. Heil challenges the proponents of propositions as truth-bearers to provide an account of the relation between propositions and truth-makers (p. 73). Since there is no apparent difference between a true proposition and an obtaining state of affairs, truth seems not to be a matter of a proposition’s corresponding to an obtaining state of affairs. I’m inclined to respond that propositions are true in virtue of their correspondence to existing states, where a state is understood as an entity’s having an attribute. Thus, a proposition, p, is true just when there is an entity, e, and a state, s, such that: s is identical with e’s having the attribute of being such that p. E.g., the proposition that Fido chases Morris is true, just when there exists a state of Fido identical with Fido’s having the attribute of being such that Fido chases Morris. Since there is a clear distinction between truth and existence, and since, while propositions are abstract, states of concreta are concrete, a true proposition and an existing state seem to be different.

Transcendent Universals. Heil finds it very odd that we could arrive at the existence of sharable Platonic properties “solely on the basis of philosophical theorizing” (p. 149). The Platonic realist may plausibly respond that this isn’t so odd because, even so, these transcendent universals are hypothesized on the ground that they figure in the best explanation of highly general facts about what we experience.

Undetachable Spatial Parts. Heil defends a peculiar notion of the “top half” of a compound object like a book (p. 174). Heil claims that such a “top half” is an undetachable spatial part of a compound object, unlike the portion of matter that coincides with this “top half”, which he takes to be a detachable part of the compound object in question. Yet, as Heil admits, the “top half” and the “bottom half” of a compound object do not make up that object (p. 100). But, surely, if so, then the “top half” and the “bottom half” could not be parts of such an object. The notion that the “top half” and “bottom half” of a compound object are undetachable parts of that object seems to confuse parts of space with parts of an object that occupies space.

Higher-Order Properties. “An apparent difficulty with appeals to higher-order properties to account for property similarities is that second-order properties themselves bear similarity relations to one another: scarlet and crimson are similar in being red; red, blue, and orange are similar in being colors; and colours, shapes, and textures are similar in being properties. If we invoke higher-order properties to account for these similarities, we shall need a hierarchy of higher-order properties, and this looks like the start of an unhappy regress. Worse, perhaps, as we ascend the hierarchy, we move further away from our original conception of similarity. Shapes, colours, and textures are all properties, but are they thereby similar?” (p. 155). However, since there must be a single summum genus at the apex of such a hierarchy of higher-order properties, it is hard to understand why Heil is concerned about the possibility of a regress. Continuing on the upward path where Heil leaves off, properties, relations, and propositions are all abstracta, and abstracta and concreta are all entities. Being an entity is a limiting case of an ontological category. Since being an entity is the summum genus, the regress stops there. Whether or not this summum genus counts as a property, it will be a brute fact that all entities are similar in being entities. But it seems harmless that this is a brute fact. Finally, why think that as we ascend the hierarchy we are moving away from our original conception of similarity, as opposed to our considering items that are similar in increasingly abstract ways?

Colors.Heil defends a Lockean account of colors. Colors are dispositions of things to cause sensations of color in us; things have these dispositions in virtue of their micro-structural qualities. An account of this kind has the highly plausible consequence that our sensations of color do not resemble the things that cause them. Yet, such an account conflicts with an intuitive naïve conception of colors as a distinctive class of visually perceivable qualities of things. I wonder whether Heil takes this conflict seriously enough. If one believes that this conflict provides a decisive objection to a dispositional account of color, then one may well conclude that our everyday attributions of colors to objects are false and that only sensations or the like are really colored.

Ockham’s Razor. “Even if simplicity is limited to numbers of entities posited, this surely must be understood as pertaining, not to the number of particular entities, but to the number of kinds of entity. You do not simplify physics by cutting down on the number of electrons” (p. 147). However, the considerations adduced by Copernicus in favor of his heliocentric theory seem to provide a historically prominent counterexample to these claims. Copernicus cogently argued that because his heliocentric theory needed far fewer epicycles than the prevailing geocentric theory, his theory was superior (even though epicycles were still needed).

Primitive Similarites. Heil’s modes stand in primitive relations of perfect similarity and imperfect similarity. Since Heil rejects universals, he seems to be committed to the existence of relations in the sense of particularized ways in which things are related. Because there appear to be indefinitely many particular ways in which things are perfectly or imperfectly similar, it seems that Heil’s ontology requires indefinitely many primitive relations. Yet, primitive relations should not be multiplied unnecessarily. These considerations raise questions about whether Heil’s ontology of modes is as theoretically advantageous as it might appear to be.

Substances. “A commitment to an ontology of objects, however, is not a commitment to material corpuscles. What the fundamental objects are is anybody’s guess. The answer is not something to be had a priori, but only by appeal to empirical theories advanced in basic physics. We need not imagine that the fundamental objects are particle-like. Objects could be fields. Perhaps there is but a single object: space, or space-time, or some all-embracing quantum field” (p. 177). Heil’s claim that space-time or the like could be a substance is unintuitive. Indeed, it seems possible that the universe is best understood in terms of space-time and an event ontology. This seems to imply that space-time is necessarily insubstantial. Moreover, Heil’s characterization of a substance as . possessor of properties not itself a property (p. 179) does not seem to lend theoretical support to his claim, since it seems that non-substantial entities other than properties possess properties, e.g., events, collections, and boundaries. Thus, Heil’s characterization of substance seems not to provide a sufficient condition for substantiality. So, it is far from clear that if space-time is a possessor of properties not itself a property, then space-time is a substance. For these reasons, I do not find it plausible that space-time or the like could be a substance.

According to Heil, our belief that ordinary items like lumps of bronze, statues, mountains, trees, and people are substances could turn out to be false. For example, such items could turn out to be qualities [of regions of space-time]. Heil also defends the thesis that if this belief were to turn out to be false, then it would nonetheless be true that there are lumps of bronze, statues, mountains, trees, and people. Heil defends this thesis by arguing that our concepts of such items are not concepts of substances, but rather, are concepts of items that possess certain properties or stand in certain relations, although our tacit acceptance of the Picture Theory could well lead us to mistakenly think otherwise. I find this defense unconvincing because prima facie it is a category mistake to characterize ordinary items like lumps of bronze, statues, mountains, trees, and people as insubstantial, e.g., as qualities. If characterizing such items as insubstantial is a category mistake, then our concepts of items of this kind are concepts of substances, and such items could not turn out to be insubstantial. In that case, if our belief that there are substantial lumps of bronze, statues, mountains, trees, and people were to turn out to be false, then it would not be true that there are lumps of bronze, statues, mountains, trees, and people.