From Inquiry to Demonstrative Knowledge: New Essays on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics

Placeholder book cover

J. H. Lesher (ed.), From Inquiry to Demonstrative Knowledge: New Essays on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, Academic Printing and Publishing, 2010, 211pp., $28.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781926598017.

Reviewed by Christopher Shields, University of Oxford


Published as consecutive numbers of the journal Apeiron, these conference proceedings reproduce papers delivered at the Duke-UNC-Chapel Hill Conference in Ancient Philosophy held in 2009 on the topic of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics. These papers are intended for specialists in Ancient Philosophy and, more narrowly, for those with a research focus on Aristotle's account of epistêmê (science, or knowledge, or perhaps branch of knowledge -- several of the papers query the meaning of the term in Aristotle's use and so also its most suitable rendering in English). Despite its narrow focus, given the liveliness and accessibility of several of its papers, the volume may prove of interest to a wider audience, including philosophers of science and epistemologists concerned with questions of first principles.

The volume comprises five papers, each followed by a commentary, some more and some less independent of their target papers; a brief, useful introduction by the editor; and three indices, of passages, of modern names, and of subjects. Greek words are sometimes transliterated and sometimes not, depending, it seems, upon the preferences of the authors. (Some manifest both preferences.) The volume is reasonably well produced, though below the standard of a single, continuous treatise, with some inconsistencies in formatting, again, it seems, depending upon the preferences of individual authors.

The contributors and their primary contentions, in brief:

(1) In 'Aristotle's Natural Science: the Many and the One,' James Lennox draws attention, crisply and fairly, to a tension in Aristotle's presentation and practice of epistêmê: while often speaking as if all natural science were somehow single in content and method, Aristotle equally calls attention to the subject-specific peculiarities of methods suited to distinct branches of natural science (so Meteorologica I 1 and De Partibus Animalium I 1), thus leaving the impression that he finds less unity of method in practice than he would ideally like in theory. Lennox's judiciously tentative conclusion: 'at some point Aristotle realized that the goal of a unified knowledge … was not to be achieved by means of a single, undifferentiated method of investigation' (21). In her equally judicious comments, Gisela Striker provides reason for supposing both that the divergence Aristotle encounters in practice is only to be expected given the differences in his subject matters and that this need not upset his general drive towards unity in method unduly.

(2) When reading the Posterior Analytics, one forms the impression that the scientist succeeds by fastening on static, unalterable features of reality: the premises of demonstrations, the sorts of deductions used to lay bare the causal structures of the world in scientific explanation, must be necessary, more intelligible than their conclusions, and universal in scope (APo 71b16-25, 74b5). Yet when describing animals and their activities, Aristotle spends a great deal of time reflecting on patterns of development and on processes of various sorts. In 'Aristotle's Syllogistic Model of Knowledge and the Biological Sciences: Demonstrating Natural Processes,' Mariska Leunissen contends that this sort of emphasis should not be thought to represent a significant discontinuity within Aristotle's conception of epistêmê. On the contrary, already in Posterior Analytics II 12 Aristotle shows himself concerned to account for change and development within epistêmê; so, the picture of static necessity and invariance within the Posterior Analytics is overdrawn. Allan Gotthelf endorses the general tenor of Leunissen's argument, and indeed finds her account of the sort of attention Aristotle devotes to the chronological order of generation in his Generation of Animals 'virtually flawless' (72). Even so, he finds ample room to disagree with her treatment of the extraordinarily difficult 'teleological syllogism' and its role in tensed explanation in Aristotle.

(3) In 'The Place of the Posterior Analytics in Aristotle's Thought, with Particular Reference to the Poetics,' Richard McKirahan explores the perennial question of the relationship between model and practice in Aristotelian science. As he observes, 'A traditional problem is how to account for the fact that none of Aristotle's scientific work follows the APo model. This is clearly true' (76). After setting forth some developmental hypotheses about the order of Aristotle's writings, McKirahan argues that even if the Posterior Analytics is an early work of Aristotle's, there is little reason to suppose that he abandons its primary prescriptions as he engages in his scientific inquiries. Instead, although no work fully respects the straightjacketing demands of the Posterior Analytics, many clearly bear its marks and indeed will not be fully understood without appreciating that fact. McKirahan's unlikely -- and delightfully illuminating -- suggestion for a test case is a work he fairly calls an 'outlier' in this debate: the Poetics. C. D. C. Reeve offers an informed set of criticisms, together with a series of rich suggestions of his own about the role of dialectic in and out of epistêmê. Both papers repay careful study and together they constitute rich and productive exchange about Aristotle's conception of epistêmê in the Posterior Analytics and its relation to the rest of his corpus.

(4) The remaining two papers deal with the final chapter of the Posterior Analytics. In this chapter, Aristotle describes a process of knowledge acquisition, according to which knowers move from perception to memory, from memory to experience (empeiria), and from experience to a grasp of first principles (nous) (APo. 100a10-b6). Scholars have puzzled how it should be possible, according to Aristotle, to move from perception to the unmediated apprehension (nous) of first principles in this way. Knowledge of first principles puts us in touch with necessary and universal features of reality; perception trades in the particular and contingent.

Miira Tuominen explicates this process in 'Back to Posterior Analytics II 19: Aristotle on the Knowledge of Principles.' She proposes to deal with the difficulties many have located in the chapter by understanding it in relation to the whole of the Posterior Analytics: 'my aim is to illuminate how I see APo II 19 and its account of how we come to know the principles in the context of the whole treatise and how, I think, reading the chapter in that context alleviates, or perhaps rather circumvents, some qualms concerning it' (119). J. H. Lesher finds himself in broad agreement with Tuominen's overarching thesis, but turns critical attention on her treatment of a key but elusive crux of the chapter, in which Aristotle offers a battle analogy to explain how settled states (hexeis) come to be present in us on the basis of experience and so ultimately on the basis of perception (APo. 100a10-12). The final purport of this analogy is no doubt permanently contestable. Even so, Lesher does much to illuminate it by discussing its terms in philologically informed detail.

(5) The remaining paper on the last chapter of the work, 'Αἴσθησις, Ἐμπειρία, and the Advent of Universals in Posterior Analytics II 19' by Gregory Salmieri, connects the chapter to Aristotle's discussions of universality in Posterior Analytics I 4-5 and 24 as well as to discontinuous remarks scattered throughout the whole of the second book. He plausibly urges in addition that a proper elucidation of the chapter requires that attention be paid to Aristotle's cognitive diction in De Anima iii. David Bronstein offers acute critical comments, effectively closing the volume with a fruitful set of questions for future research into the chapter.

As will be appreciated from these summaries, the two dominant themes of the volume are: (i) Aristotle's approach to epistêmê in theory and implementation; and (ii) Aristotle's fascinating if frustrating genetic account of how knowledge of necessity eventuates from perception within the framework of a thoroughgoing empiricism. Both topics receive extended, instructive discussion.

The volume offers a welcome mix of established and younger scholars, all writing at the state of the art and all engaging issues of abiding interest pursuant to the rich and demanding text of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics.