From Mastery to Mystery: A Phenomenological Foundation for an Environmental Ethic

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Bryan E. Bannon, From Mastery to Mystery: A Phenomenological Foundation for an Environmental Ethic, Ohio University Press, 2014, 200pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780821420645.

Reviewed by Michael E. Zimmerman, University of Colorado Boulder


Bryan E. Bannon's book is an ambitious effort to lay the foundation for environmental ethics (EE), by developing an alternative to the nature-society dualism and substance metaphysics that are arguably central features of modernity. Instead of viewing nature as a monolithic, hierarchically-ordered, systemic, ahistorical, and transcendent domain needed to stabilize an historical human society, Bannon calls on work by Bruno Latour, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty to depict nature itself as historical, as "an actant, an assemblage of bodies contingently related such that there is an order, always subject to revision and reconstitution, that emerges from the interrelationships between smaller constituent bodies." (36) In emphasizing hybridity, defined as the complex and generative interplay of the human and the non-human, Bannon calls for a dramatic shift in human self-understanding, one that emphasizes human entwinement with the multiple and multiply active constituents of the "common world," while at the same time acknowledging the particular contributions of human actants to that world. He promotes a version of process metaphysics, according to which events constitute the world. Natural phenomena are neither passive nor substances, but rather interrelated events endowed with agency.

Bannon maintains that caring for nature must be in place before people will seek to protect it: "we must alter the very way nature is conceived in order to inspire the necessary changes in affection that can motivate a healthier relationship with nature." (2) He is under no illusion about barriers standing in the way of such a conceptual shift. Although noting that Neil Evernden prefers to avoid the term "nature," because it has long served as a conceptual support for politically oppressive attitudes, Bannon defends the term, insofar it already connects many people emotionally to the non-human world. Nevertheless, he does seek "a more progressive conception sense of nature" that will allow us "to understand and repair the damage we have wrought within the natural world" (7). A successful basis for an EE must emphasize the ontological continuity between humanity and nature, while not denying important differences, as Val Plumwood has pointed out. Bannon affirms nature's active interdependence with humankind.

To develop this view, Bannon explores Latour's discourse about modernity's desire to separate nature from society, so as to prevent either one from contaminating the other. The modern idea of an other-than-human, monolithic nature has generated a correspondingly monolithic science, which promotes undemocratic social attitudes and political practices, as well as serious environmental problems. (13) In place of such nature, Latour prefers to speak of the "common world" composed of networks of hybrid (human/nonhuman) actants constituted by complex interrelationships. (23) Latour maintains that the sciences, despite their limitations, can identify what counts as actants, thereby letting them "speak" in ways that reveal their agency, although not an abstract autonomy.

Latour's common or "collective" world may provide, according to Bannon, "a foundation from which normative position-taking is possible without also asserting the unquestionable authority of that foundation." (18) The rise of such a nonmodern world, or the "pluriverse," would require eliminating the dualistic work of "purification," the idea of a monolithic and transcendent "Nature," and modernity's disenfranchising supposition that non-humans (living and non-living) lack both history and agency.

Bannon's thesis is that this nonmodern pluriverse can be both illuminated and enhanced by bringing Latour into dialogue with two key phenomenologists, Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. To do so, he must lay to rest Latour's well known suspicion that phenomenology reduces beings to phenomena imminent within transcendental consciousness. In expertly orchestrating a complex and sometimes surprising interplay among these three thinkers, he develops the view, largely consistent with process philosophy, that the common world is populated not by substances, but rather by interdependent events/actants.

In the first of two insightful chapters on Heidegger, Bannon explains that for Heidegger Aristotle's Physics is what eventually gives rise to modernity's techno-industrial disclosure of all beings (including humans) solely as standing-reserve (Bestand) for enhancing the techno-system's power. I cannot begin to summarize Bannon's intricate discussion, but I will note the importance of his decision to foreground the role that polemos plays in Heidegger's conception of temporal-historical human existence. In the second chapter, he shows that Heidegger avoided using the word "nature," derived from the Latin translation of physis, and instead preferred to speak of self-concealing "earth," which he contrasts with "world," the historical, linguistic clearing within which entities can "be" insofar as they show themselves in their intelligibility. Counseling attunement to the "mystery" of things, a mystery that techno-science cannot countenance (63), Heidegger surmised that modernity's one-dimensional understanding of being is only temporary. In a few centuries, he prophesized, the clearing may be altered, thereby making possible a non-domineering relationship between human Dasein, a relationship that seemingly has much in common with Latour's common world.

Despite addressing some of Latour's reservations about Heidegger's phenomenological ontology, for instance, by showing Heidegger did not follow Husserl in holding that beings are "immanent" in consciousness, Bannon concedes that issues remain. For example, Heidegger claims that human existence is constituted as the "clearing" or openness within which beings can manifest themselves intelligibly and in that sense "be." By confining the clearing solely to humankind, however, Heidegger remains vulnerable to Latour's criticism that phenomenology remains humanistic and anthropocentric, thus antithetical to the idea of a truly interdependent pluriverse.

In chapter four, arguably the book's centerpiece, Bannon shows how Merleau-Ponty's move from Husserlian to Heideggerian phenomenology can shed light on and elaborate Latour's idea of the common world. Building on the effort by David Abram and other philosophers who have read Merleau-Ponty as an environmental thinker, he maintains that the latter's mature view is largely consistent with the hybridic, mutually constituting, nonmodern common world. Bannon proposes to develop:

[Merleau-Ponty's] notion of "flesh" in terms of a generalized embodiment, rather than being a specific aspect of human being or human perception, which is how it is usually interpreted. On [this basis], Merleau-Ponty is able to provide a conception of nature that does not fall prey to Latour's and Heidegger's criticisms of the concept. (99)

Bannon describes Merleau-Ponty's early effort to overcome nature-mind dualism "by presenting the centrality of behavior and form (Gestalt) as mediating concepts that are meant to establish a third way [neither mechanistic nor teleological] of conceiving of nature." (101) Merleau-Ponty makes clear that behavior can be "generalized into the structure of expression," the latter being central for all human-nonhuman interactions, which are always mediated through various institutions, such as perception, language, personal experience, and history. Dividing the world into three orders -- physical (quantitative), behavioral (valuing), and mental (signifying) -- Merleau-Ponty emphasizes that all phenomena are historical and relational, and also include a measure of significance. Nature and the various forms we both ascribe to and discover within it are human inventions posited "to manage and organized the perceived partial totalities," but the "forms" and "structures" that humans use to describe the world refer to an "original text," namely, observed physical systems. (110-111)

In his unpublished MS The Prose of the World, Merleau-Ponty refines his account of expression to include "the interplay of nature and history," and elaborates on the importance of intersubjectivity in nature and (human) history. (112) Subject-object ontology cannot account for the fact that "signification" arises not merely from mental activity, but instead from the mutual interchange between human and non-human. Calling on the work of Saussure, Merleau-Ponty maintains that the mediation of things in the perceived world makes possible communication, which requires a referent (third term) to concretize the "mutual differentiation" at work in communication between two speakers. In light of such considerations, Merleau-Ponty now concludes that there is not an "original text" of the world, for otherwise language would be mere "translation," rather than a way to differentiate and articulate the world. (115) Communication is a dialectical process involving mediation of things and mediation of institutions, largely because of the "horizonal nature of perception." (117) The perceptual field is always articulated in advance by shared cultural institutions, but these reified institutions may be replaced at times by novel modes of behavior that allow for the emergence of alternative forms and new significations.

Merleau-Ponty posits a "universality of feeling" that emphasizes the priority of intersubjectivity (as opposed to the independent cogito) in making communication possible. In maintaining that affect is the means by which bodies relate to one another, he anticipates his later concept of flesh. (119) The commonality of the world lies in the multiplicity of perceptual fields related to the sensible (natural) world and (inter)connected by the universality of feeling. A thing showing up within a perceptual field is not an independently existing substance with properties, but rather a "significative nucleus" that unifies to some extent the (perceiving) body's diverse perceptual intentions, although the latter are never complete and always perspectival. Something we perceive is best understood as a nexus of relationships, as what Latour would call an event, the duration, stability, and significance of which is dependent on the circumstances constituted by complex relationships.

Although all living bodies share in a common world of feeling, and are differentiated by the mediating work of human institutions, "this intertwining of nature and history occurs within the lived-experience of a perceiving body," thereby privileging the primacy of (human) perception. In The Visible and the Invisible, however, influenced by Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty seeks to move beyond phenomenology of the lived body to an ontology that ascribes to all beings a mode of openness that obtain whether or not human openness exists. (125)

Whereas Heidegger maintained that only human existence is endowed with the clearing or no-thingness within which things can present themselves, Merleau-Ponty extends "no-thingess" to embrace the "absences, concealments and divergences that appear in the perceived world." (129) The negativity, absence, or divergence (l'écart) necessary for presence (being) is found not only in the human, but in the common world as well. All beings, even rocks, are members of the mutable, interdependent relational totality constituting the flesh of the common world. All beings can be affected and are in this sense open. "Calling nature flesh," writes Bannon, "entails that it is a contingently formed, behaving ensemble of affective relations." (135) Merleau-Ponty's late works reflect the influence of Alfred North Whitehead's process philosophy, the key concept of which is the "actual occasion" or event, in which Whitehead rethinks Leibniz's monads in the light of quantum physics. Each of these primordial events or occasions stand in relation with ("prehends") the past of the whole world, but is also capable of a measure of novelty, however meager it may be. The universe is open and creative, then, not a complex machine constituted by parts rigidly organized according to causal laws. Bannon shows the proximity of these and other ideas to Latour's idea of actants, which the latter investigates in his influential actor-network theory.

Building on Heidegger's notion that physis (nature) loves to hide, that no single mode of disclosure can ever reveal all aspects of beings (human and non-human), Merleau-Ponty affirms that each actant, each body, each occasion has its own primordial mode of expression, and hence that "every body can be said to contribute to the common life of nature." (159) Nature is not a human construct, nor is nature wholly independent of human society, but instead is a mutually dependent, co-constituting, ever-changing, ever-evolving domain of significance.

Bannon exhibits an enviable ability to engage three difficult thinkers (four, if one incudes Whitehead) in mutually enriching dialectical engagements. For instance, Latour's concept of the common world can in fact be enriched by the phenomenology of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty; and Heidegger's notion of the clearing can be transformed by Merleau-Ponty's claim that the beings constituting the "flesh of the world" are all open in their own, yet mutually interrelated ways. Bannon demonstrates, however, that Merleau-Ponty's work has more in common with and makes a greater contribution to Latour's idea of the common world or pluriverse than does Heidegger's work. The two chapters he devotes to Heidegger's philosophy, although excellent in their own right, could have been reduced to one chapter, thereby allowing for a less compressed, more accessible treatment of Merleau-Ponty.

Toward the end of his book, Bannon addresses some possible concerns that his view of the common world may provoke on the part of environmentalists who adhere to a more traditional view of nature. Given that in the pluriverse "there are no permanent properties or configurations of substance that are in need of protection," "preserving" nature seems a dubious enterprise. (145) Bannon also maintains, rightly in my view, that no amount of environmental damage humans may cause can bring about "the end of nature" understood as the pluriverse. Nevertheless, humans must reckon with the consequences for wreaking havoc on the common world. Referencing Latour, Bannon notes that a non-substantial, historical, interdependent, and ever-changing nature leaves us with "only contingent, politically negotiated orders" to assess how we are affecting the common world "for better or worse." (145)

If there is no fixed nature to preserve, however, why should we not act merely prudentially to maximize human well being, without pushing natural processes into unacceptable and/or unsustainable new arrangements? Bannon's answer: if we were to adopt a relational ontology, according to which we ourselves are but one kind of mutually arising being among countless others, we would also develop a different feeling for the common world. Such a feeling might lead us to temper our human-centeredness in a way consistent with the aims of an EE embracing the common world. (155) Latour calls for a new, nonmodern "constitution that explicitly politicizes the relations among beings." (156) In the non-dualistic, interrelated, intersubjective, agential, pan-experiential, and communicative world, according to Bannon, non-humans "are to be engaged with as fellow citizens in this political activity of constituting the common world." (157; my emphasis. There is clearly a connection between the idea of fellow citizens and Aldo Leopold's idea that humans are plain citizens of the land community.) Bannon proposes that intertwining the views of Latour, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty "opens the possibility for us to experience certain kinds of feelings toward various human behaviors," feelings that might challenge the idea of mastery "by embracing nature's mystery." (153)

In light of the idea of a common world mutually constituted by interrelated events, Bannon maintains that we ought to take many things into account before acting, including the entwinement of the interests of the various actants that may be affected by that action, how the action may affect those actants, how interpreting that entwinement opens or closes alternative courses of action, and how one's relations with other beings will be changed by the proposed action. Such considerations must reflect our own feelings and those of other beings, insofar as they all are actants capable of being affected in one way or another. Focusing on one's own place or region helps to limit the scope of what one ought to take into consideration. (161-162) Although no "overarching harmony of all beings" is possible (162), one may at least strive to act in ways that allow for one's own eco-region to re-establish not merely a workable but a healthier order, even after having been perturbed by human action.

However appealing Bannons's foundation for EE may be to some philosophers, it would have to be considerably more user friendly if it were to elicit the feelings required for people dramatically to alter their goals and behavior out of concern for the multitude of actants that mutually constitute the common world. Such feelings would have to be strong enough, for example, to counteract human desire to have and consume things, a desire that helps to generate the conviction that whatever else nature may be, it is at least in part a storehouse of goods needed for human survival and prosperity. Of course, all environmental philosophers are familiar with the gap between their sophisticated analyses and recommendations, on the one hand, and the rough and tumble, nature-exploiting socio-economic world, on the other.

Let us suppose for a moment that all living beings (and for Bannon, perhaps all actants) are morally considerable. Is there a threshold beyond which beings have sufficient moral standing to require changes in our behavior? If we make the threshold too low, would we be obliged to sweep the pathway in front of us, as do the Jains, lest we tread upon an insect? For most people, ascribing moral considerability to non-human mammals is already a big step. The prospect of persuading a large number of people to ascribe moral considerability to virtually everything seems daunting, although Holmes Rolston III has made a case for doing so.

Perhaps we should focus on the interdependently constituting pluriverse, rather than on the individuals arising within it. Would the moral requirements of an EE founded on Bannon's view invoke major new prohibitions against activities that degrade what we now call ecosystems, but which may take on new names later? Indeed, would techno-science, industry, commerce, politics, and other social institutions all undergo significant changes, if society adopted the pluriverse view? Would human subjectivity and attendant desire undergo comparable alterations, such that humankind could establish something approaching I-Thou relations with the common world, as opposed to the modern world in which nature shows up as a collection of inert stuff endowed solely with instrumental value? If Bannon were to address such questions in later work, I, for one, would certainly like to read what he has to say, given how much I learned from his first book.