From Morality to the End of Reason: An Essay on Rights, Reasons, and Responsibility

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Ingmar Persson, From Morality to the End of Reason: An Essay on Rights, Reasons, and Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2013, 328pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199676552.

Reviewed by Ishtiyaque Haji, University of Calgary


Ingmar Persson proposes that common-sense morality, deeply rooted in evolution, includes principles that display a sort of asymmetry: we have stronger reasons not to perform some actions than we have to perform any actions. One principle is the doctrine of negative rights (DNR): we have moral rights against others that they do not interfere with us and our property, but no rights that they "help us to sustain ourselves or our property" (p. 1). A second is the act-omission doctrine (AOD): with certain harms, there are stronger moral reasons against causing them than against not preventing them. Two other constituents of this morality are the doctrine of double effect (DDE): "there are some harms that it is permissible to cause as foreseen side effects of a good end, but not to bring about as intended means to the good end, or as ends" (p. 2); and the principle that responsibility is causally-based (CBR): the more one's causal contribution to an event, the greater one's responsibility for it, other things equal.

Rejecting these principles, Persson argues that rights should be replaced by beneficence and CBR by a conception of responsibility predicated on behavior that is under the influence of practical reasons. The resulting revisionist morality is symmetrical. Beneficence implies that moral reasons for performing some acts can be as strong as moral reasons to refrain from any acts. Reason-based responsibility implies that we can be as strongly morally responsible for (i) what we let happen as for what we do, and (ii) outcomes we cause together with others as we would have been had we caused them on our own. The symmetrical morality is, thus, more demanding than what it replaces. However, it is less 'authoritative' because reasons of beneficence are weaker than those of rights, and, as Persson argues, there are no desire-independent external practical reasons. If we pre-theoretically expect a moral reason to be a reason for any moral agent, irrespective of the desires of the agent, the nonexistence of practical external reasons may make compliance with an extended, more demanding morality challenging.

This is an extremely ambitious and tightly argued work. Its breadth is, well, breath-taking as is its caliber of argumentation. It contains a wealth of deep insights about numerous topics in ethics and other areas in philosophy. In this short review, I can do very little justice to its extensive reach and its numerous virtues.

In addition to an introduction and conclusion, the book has 12 chapters. DNR is the subject of chapter 1. The most fundamental negative general right is (1) the categorical right to the use of one's body and its psycho-physical capacities (p. 19). The second general negative right, conditional on our having the first, is the right to "extra-somatic property if we acquire it in a certain way by the use of our capacities" (p. 24). The first occupancy theory, FO, explicates the 'ground' of these general rights: (2) The right that we have to anything is based solely on (a) our being the first to occupy it, or, (b) the right to it being autonomously transferred from its first occupier (p. 50). Of the four arguments against DNR, the most general "constitution" argument adds these additional premises to (1) and (2): (3) We have a right to the whole of our bodies only if we have a right to all of the parts into which they can be divided (p. 51); (4) Our bodies can be divided into parts -- molecules, atoms, etc. -- none of which is such that one has a right to it given the truth of (2). Since these micro-particles, for example, are continually replaced, one is presumably not the first one to occupy them or make use of them (pp. 51-52). From (3) and (4), it follows that we do not have any right to our bodies.

Chapter 3 is devoted to explaining AOD. Persson claims that CBR, like DNR, is "necessary to account for AOD" (p. 88). He also defends interesting theses about causation including the thesis that causation is observable.

In chapter 4, against AOD, Persson develops two engaging paradoxes, each meant to sustain the conclusion that, assuming AOD, sometimes there is something that one is permitted and not permitted to let happen. Here's a summary of one of them. Take it that (1) it would be wrong of you to kill Vic now, and (2) you are permitted to let Vic be killed now. You feel the onset of a muscular spasm, and you foresee that it will cause your finger to squeeze the trigger, thereby bringing about Vic's death. You can quell the spasm but intentionally don't do so. You let yourself fire the gun, by moving a finger, and, hence, you let yourself kill Vic. So this is true: (3) If you let Vic be killed now, what you let occur is that Vic be killed by yourself now. From (2) and (3), we infer, (4), you are permitted to let yourself kill Vic now. Add this premise: (5) If it would be wrong of you to kill Vic now it would be wrong of you to let yourself kill Vic now. From (1) and (5), we infer, (6), it would be wrong of you to let yourself kill Vic now.

In chapter 5, Persson argues for epiphenomenalism -- the view that mental events are not causes of anything physical. He distinguishes between causal epiphenomenalism (which he rejects) and explanatory epiphenomenalism (which he accepts). Although mental explanations do not presuppose causation, they presuppose a kind of explanatory 'contentual relation' (p. 132): "when we bring about something because we intend (or desire) it to be p, we experience ourselves as bringing something about because it fits the content of our thought, that is, that p" (p. 129).

In chapter 6, Persson argues that even sophisticated versions of DDE fall to counterexamples such as Loop, in which a trolley will kill five people unless you redirect it onto a sidetrack, in which case it will kill one. The sidetrack loops back to the main track on which the five are strapped. Here, it seems that it is permissible (intentionally) to kill the one to save the five (p. 147). This chapter also contains an interesting discussion of the dilution of causally-based responsibility. CBR seeks to capture several ideas about responsibility including (i) the less the causally based responsibility for a harm brought about is, the more likely it is that it will be permissible to bring this thing about (p. 154); and (ii) we are less responsible for harm that we cause if "this is achieved merely by manipulating a pre-existent process destined to cause harm to cause less harm, rather than by initiating a new cause of the harm" (p. 154).

Reasons of beneficence and CBR are scrutinized in chapter 7. Persson proposes that since it is often indeterminate what benefits individuals most -- for example, we might have to balance "a greater number of beneficiaries and a higher average level of well-being against each other" (p. 164), and so indeterminate which outcome is best overall -- our "moral goal is not to promote the best outcome (all things considered), but an outcome which is good enough (all things considered)" (p. 165). He calls the principle that we ought to do what is good enough "GE."

CBR's replacement, the reason-based conception of responsibility, consists of two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions to be responsible for something: this thing is based on our practical reasons and is not forced on us (p. 171). This conception of responsibility is forward-looking as opposed to desert-based in that the prospect of overt blame or praise (or punishment or reward) can affect the outcome of practical deliberation; they can function as reasons to encourage or discourage us to behave in certain ways (pp. 172-73). Persson proposes that although responsibility does not require freedom to do otherwise, it requires a 'deliberative openness'; it must be "epistemically possible for us that we either decide to perform an action or decide not to perform it" (p. 173).

Actualism is the view that one ought to perform an action if and only if what would happen were one to perform it would be better than what would happen were one to perform any alternative. Possibilism is the rival view that one ought to perform an action if and only if what could happen if one were to perform it would be better than what could happen if one were to perform any alternative. In chapter 8, Persson first argues for possibilism. He then proposes that various cases involving overdetermination both tell against DNR and lead to refinements of GE. A key point underscored is that what one ought to do (in the sorts of cases of interest) will often depend on whether what we decide to do turns on our being able to make reliable predictions about what other relevant agents will do. Finally, in this chapter, Persson argues against CBR and in favor of the reason-based view of responsibility by focusing on collective action. In the intriguing cases he considers, he proposes that what agents are responsible for and their degree of responsibility be fixed by the reasons on which they act, and not by their causal contribution to the result (p. 200).

The burden of chapter 9 is to sustain the non-transitivity of value by arguing for the non-transitivity of supervenient properties on the assumption that values are supervenient. These properties are intrinsic properties "in . . . that it is possible to determine that something, X, has such a property by considering only X and its parts" (p. 202).

In chapter 10, Persson addresses the issue of whether what we ought to do is to maximize actual or expected value. His novel answer appears to be that we ought to do both. His point of departure is this case advanced by Frank Jackson (1991, pp. 462-63): Jill's evidence correctly indicates that giving John drug A will effect a partial cure, and giving him no drug will leave him permanently incurable. But the evidence leaves it open whether giving John drug B or C will cure him completely or kill him. Assume that B will cure completely and C will kill. What ought Jill to do? One of Persson's suggestions is to distinguish between what one ought to try (choose or decide) to do and what one ought to do. Regarding the former, one should act on the evidence accessible to one -- one should do what maximizes expected value. With the latter, one should do what maximizes actual value.

In chapter 11, Persson argues that there are no epistemic reasons to justify trans-experiential beliefs -- "fundamental empirical beliefs which go beyond the immediate sense experience that we have" (p. 241) -- such as beliefs in the external world, the deliverances of memory, induction, and other minds. Still, there are pragmatic justifications for them: we would not be able to survive without acting on these beliefs. It is enough for our survival if these beliefs are held and in fact generally reliable even though they lack epistemic justification.

Finally, in chapter 12, Persson argues that there are no external reasons -- non-natural desire-independent reasons -- and so there can be no practical justification for our intrinsic desires. Non-naturalist externalism is false because (among other things) if it were true, there would be necessary, synthetic, and a priori knowable normative truths, such as there is reason to want to avoid pain for its own sake, but there are no such truths (pp. 276-81). Persson proposes that it isn't clear why not having justificatory reasons for our intrinsic desires should require us to abandon them.

I end with two brief sets of comments, one on obligation and the other on responsibility. Regarding the former, suppose Jill tries to do what she ought -- give A -- but luckily ends with B being given. Persson says, "there is no reason to regret that this . . . failure occurred, though there would have been such a reason if the . . . failure had caused her to fail to do something that she ought" (p. 223). However, Jill's lacking regret for failing to try to do what she ought is no reason to believe that she has fortuitously done what she ought to do.

Sometimes Persson suggests that there are two senses of 'ought,' the evidential sense ('e-ought'), which is to maximize expected value, and the factual ('f-ought'), which is to maximize actual value (pp. 229-30). On this view, one may propose that Jill e-ought to give A, and f-ought to give B. But Persson also insists that although Jill ought to try to give A, she ought not to give A.

If one agrees that Jill ought to give B (and so ought not to give A), why not simply endorse the Moorean view that Jill ought to give B? Supplement this view with the addition that in situations when one does not know what one ought to do because of lack of appropriate evidence, one should rely on other considerations, such as a policy not to take what one deems to be unacceptable risks, to decide what to do. In such situations, a conscientious agent would willingly do wrong by giving A because this is what the policy dictates that she do.

In addition Persson is aware of the following potential objection. Suppose that Jill could give B only by trying to give B. Then she ought to try to give B if (roughly) it is true that if x is a necessary means to doing y, one can avoid doing x, and one ought to do y, then one ought to do x, too. For then it would follow that Jill ought to try to give A and she ought to try to give B, although she cannot try to do both. Persson's way out is to deny that trying to do an action can be a necessary means of doing it (p. 230). However, this is controversial. Suppose that, given your phobia, you can pick up the harmless snake only if you try to pick it up. It doesn't strike me as incoherent to suppose that trying to pick up the snake is a necessary means of picking it up.

Or perhaps the view is that there is a single sense of 'ought.' What one ought to try to do is to maximize expected value, and what one ought to do is to maximize actual value. To his credit, Persson says nothing to commit him to this dubious view. Choosing or trying to do something -- giving drug A -- is an action, as is doing something -- giving B. I see no plausible reason to treat these differently in that expected value should be considered with the former and actual value with the latter, when the issue is what one ought to try to do or do.

Regarding responsibility, if forward-looking blameworthiness is oriented to influencing behavior and not to registering anything about desert, then it is not clear why the sort of control that this type of responsibility requires should be the sort that desert-entailing responsibility requires. So, for instance, suppose that to be blameworthy in the desert-entailing sense for a decision, one must be able to recognize a suitably broad array of sufficient reasons to do otherwise, and be able to do otherwise for those reasons. It seems that one could influence behavior even though one were not reasons-responsive in this sense. One may recognize that if one does any one of a cluster of things, one will be adversely affected, and if one wants to avoid these detrimental consequences, one should not do these things. (Strict liability laws may effectively influence behavior.) It would seem, then, that the control that forward-looking blameworthiness requires need be nothing like the control that desert-entailing blameworthiness requires. If this is granted, one should be cautious about endorsing the following luck principle that Persson favors: The degree to which one is blameworthy for something cannot be affected by what is not in one's control, a principle that is highly reasonable when the blameworthiness in question is desert-entailing. With forward-looking blameworthiness, however, as the control it presupposes is not the sort that desert-entailing blameworthiness demands, a convincing rationale is required for the view that the luck principle also 'applies.' If a strict liability law can effectively regulate behavior, why think the luck principle is true when it is forward-looking blameworthiness that is at issue?


Jackson, Frank. 1991. "Decision-Theoretic Consequentialism and the Nearest and Dearest Objection," Ethics 101, pp. 461-82.