From Stoicism to Platonism: The Development of Philosophy, 100 BCE-100 CE

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Troels Engberg-Pedersen (ed.), From Stoicism to Platonism: The Development of Philosophy, 100 BCE-100 CE, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 399pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107166196.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto


The present volume is the fruit of a conference in Copenhagen in 2014. The occasion was the vision of the editor, Troels Engberg-Pedersen, to provide something like a synoptic account of philosophy in the so-called post-Hellenistic period of about 100 BCE to 100 CE, roughly from Panaetius (185-109 BCE) to Plutarch of Chaeronea (c. 45-125 CE). The hypothesis that Engberg-Pedersen offered to the conference participants was twofold: first, the title of this book with a question mark and second, that there is an asymmetrical relationship between the two major philosophical schools in this period, Stoicism and Platonism. A bit of context will perhaps help here. The period under investigation stands between the so-called Hellenistic period of ancient philosophy, roughly between the death of Aristotle in 322 BCE and the sack of Athens in 86 BCE or perhaps the founding of the Roman Empire in 27 BCE. During this period, in addition to the philosophical schools of Platonism and Peripateticism, there arose to prominence the Stoic, Epicurean, and Academic Sceptic schools. By the end of the period covered in this book, Platonism and Stoicism were already dominant, Peripateticism was rapidly fading, Epicureanism stood outside of the professional philosophical debates, and Academic Scepticism had withered -- on the one hand, folded back into Platonism, and on the other, mutated into a revival of a radical Pyrrhonic Scepticism. By the beginning of the 3rd century or so, Platonism had completely overwhelmed every other philosophical school to the extent that few if any Stoics or Peripatetics are even known.

Most of the essays focus on the interaction of Stoicism and Platonism, with the asymmetry in this relation revealed in the polemical reaction to, and sometimes unspoken appropriation of, Stoic doctrine by Platonists. And just to round out the story, just as Platonism gradually overwhelmed Stoicism and the other Hellenistic and post-Hellenistic schools, so eventually Christianity overwhelmed Platonism, basically putting an end to public pagan philosophy in the conveniently datable year 529 when the Academy in Athens was closed by the emperor Justinian. A notable feature of the book is the inclusion of essays that focus on the interaction of Hellenistic Jewish and early Christian thinkers with ancient Greek philosophy during this period.

Here is the Table of Contents: 1. "Introduction: A Historiographical Essay" by Troels Engberg-Pedersen; 2. "Plato, Chrysippus and Posidonius' Theory of Affective Movements" by A.G. Long; 3. "Cicero's Plato" by Malcolm Schofield; 4. "Are We Nearly There Yet? Eudorus on Aristotle's Categories" by George Boys-Stones; 5. "Stoicism and Platonism in 'Arius Didymus'" by Myrto Hatzimichali; 6. "Oikeiōsis in Stoicism, Antiochus and Arius Didymus" by Christopher Gill; 7. "The Platonist Appropriation of Stoic Epistemology" by Mauro Bonazzi; 8. "'Becoming like God'" in Platonism and Stoicism" by Gretchen Reydams-Schils; 9. "From Stoicism to Platonism: The Difficult Case of Philo of Alexandria's De Providentia I" by David T. Runia; 10. "From Cicero to Philo of Alexandria: Ascending and Descending Axes in the Interpretation of Platonism and Stoicism" by Carlos Lévy; 11. "The Love of Wisdom: Middle Platonism and Stoicism in the Wisdom of Solomon" by Gregory E. Sterling; 12. "Seneca and Epictetus on Body, Mind and Dualism" by A.A. Long; 13. "The Dilemma of Paul's Physics: Features Stoic-Platonist or Platonist-Stoic?" by Stanley Stowers; 14. "The Legacy of Musonius Rufus" by Brad Inwood; 15. "Stoic and Platonic Reflections on Naming in Early Christian Circles: Or, What's in a Name?" by Harold W. Attridge; 16. "Is Plutarch Really Hostile to the Stoics?" by Jan Opsomer; 17. "Peripatetic Appropriations of Oikeiōsis: Alexander, Mantissa Chapter 17" by Charles Brittain.

A.G. Long undertakes what the editor calls the "eirenic appropriation" of Plato by the Stoic Posidonius in the characterization of the passions. Unlike the main figures in the Old Stoa, Zeno, Chrysippus, and Cleanthes, by the 1st century BCE Stoics seemed prepared to use the insights of the "ancients" to articulate and refine the Stoic position. According to Long, Posidonius saw in Plato's account of the appetites, and above all in their role in early education, a way of explaining the irrational emotions in the actions of rational animals that was rather more nuanced than that of the Old Stoa. The Posidonian innovation is the introduction of the term "affective movements" of the soul to indicate "pre-passions" precisely what are found in children who have not yet attained the age of reason. The fact that children can be trained before they are rational gives us the ability to understand better the emotions in adults.

Schofield surveys Cicero's use of Plato in his letters, dialogues, and treatises. Not surprisingly, Cicero was most keen to appropriate Platonic ideas in his political works, De republica, De legibus, and De oratore. Appealing to Plato's Republic and Laws especially, Cicero sought to articulate the theoretical foundations of a Roman republic whose demise was just over the horizon. Cicero himself was a self-proclaimed Academic sceptic, a position that does not sit well with devotion to any doctrine, let alone any systematic doctrine, whether that be of Plato or of the Stoics. But though a professed sceptic, Cicero's practical inclinations led to him embrace models of law and community that -- especially in the case of Plato -- had the benefit of being removed from the power politics of the late Roman Republic.

Boys-Stones provides a vigorous argument against the term "transitional" to describe the philosophical period covered in this book. As he points out, any period in the history of philosophy can be viewed as "transitional" if it stands between two periods containing philosophers with markedly different orientations. Illustrative of his point is a brief treatment of the fragments of criticism of Aristotle's Categories by Eudorus of Alexandria probably sometime in the last quarter of the 1st century BCE. According to Boys-Stones, Eudoxus' "polemical appropriation" of Aristotle's Categories, treating it as a failed attempt at ontology because it does not recognize categories of the intelligible world, shows that a strong version of Platonism existed at least at the beginning of the presumed "transitional period".

Hatzimichali takes an original tack, trying to discern from the fragments associated with the 1st century BCE doxographer "Arius Didymus" what the "lay of the land" was with regard to Platonism and Stoicism in that period. According to Hatzimichali's hypothesis, we can tell from the presentation of doctrines what were the central issues debated. In addition, we can tell that by the time of this doxographer, there was a nascent dogmatic Platonism which evidently was content to use classificatory schemes from the "dominant mode of discourse" of Stoicism. Hatzimichali suggests, plausibly enough, that the systematization of Platonism was in response to the refined Stoic system. Intriguingly, our scattered evidence for Arius does not clearly identify him as a Stoic or, indeed, as belonging to any philosophical school. If, indeed, he was an "independent" philosopher, this fact would perhaps be our earliest example of such a vocation in Hellenistic culture.

Gill provides a rich and subtle analysis of the deployment of the concept of oikeiōsis in our period. The term is usually translated as "appropriation" or more expansively, "the process of making something one's own". The use of the concept in Stoic ethics is fundamental in their account of human development and human good. But it is also fundamental in the ethics of Antiochus of Ascalon, self-declared founder of a new version of the Old Platonic Academy. The central question addressed in this paper, based on testimony from Cicero, as well as from the doxography of Arius Didymus, is whether oikeiōsis is a purely Stoic concept taken over by Antiochus or whether Antiochus is correct in claiming an Old Academic provenance for it. Gill argues for the former, as do most modern scholars, but the question is complicated by the fact that both Platonists and Peripatetics, like Stoics, had teleological conceptions of the human good and, again like the Stoics, believed that virtue was, with certain rather vague qualifications, necessary and sufficient for human happiness. So, the process of oikeiōsis does appear by other names in the ethical systems of the Stoics' rivals. Antiochus may well have thought that his own act of appropriation simply allowed him to cast his dogmatic Platonism into the contemporary idiom over against the Academic scepticism that he firmly rejected.

The paper by Bonazzi aims to connect the development of systematic Platonism in the post-Hellenistic period to its confrontation with or "polemical appropriation of" Stoicism. Bonazzi focuses on the fundamental epistemological problem of the criterion. He explains that the Stoic criteria of knowledge were empirically derived ennoiai ("conceptions"). Platonists in our period embraced the criterion but only within the context of a theory of recollection according to which Forms were cognized prior to embodiment. But, as Bonazzi shows, the insufficiency of empirically derived conceptions to guarantee knowledge is mirrored in the insufficiency of recollection to guarantee knowledge, too. Thus, the sceptical argument against Stoic dogmatism was equally an argument against Platonic dogmatism. Stoics and Platonists agreed that certainty was necessary for knowledge but neither school had at this time a clear argument that certainty was attainable. Ironically, though Bonazzi does not mention this, the criteria utilized in the development of empirical epistemology beginning in the 17th century were just those employed by Academic sceptics.

Reydams-Schils explores the post-Hellenistic afterlife of the famous Platonic exhortation in Theaetetus to "become like god as far as possible by becoming just and holy with wisdom". She explores three Middle Platonic interpretations of the exhortation, from the anonymous commentary on Plato's Theaetetus, Alcinous, and Plutarch and shows how Stoic doctrine affected these interpretations. In the light of Stoic attacks on Plato's conception of justice, the anonymous commentator is led to defend Plato's exhortation based on the idea of justice as primarily an internal as opposed to a social virtue. In the Didaskalikos of Alcinous, we see a defense against an implied Stoic attack on the apparent tension in Plato between "becoming like god" as otherworldly assimilation to a purely contemplative deity and the social dimension of virtue. Alcinous, reflecting on Timaeus and Laws, tries to bring together the providential and relational aspects of divinity. For Plutarch, the divinity to be imitated is clearly the Demiurge, especially in his relational aspect as craftsman of order in the universe. Thus, the practice of virtue is a kind of crafting of order. Reydams-Schils suggests that Plutarch could have drawn on material from, among others, Musonius Rufus and Epictetus to appropriate the Stoic idea of a virtuous deity.

Runia focuses on a work by Philo of Alexandria, De providentia I, the first book of a treatise extant only in an Armenian translation. Beginning with Runia's own well-established claim that Philo considered himself a philosophical follower of Moses, he asks on the basis of this treatise how Philo reacted to Stoicism and Platonism. Runia shows that the extensive Stoic literature on divine providence provides the framework for Philo's treatise and that its contents are fairly evenly distributed between Stoic and Platonic doctrines. But Philo's commitment to Judaism leads him to lean towards Platonic accounts of providence based on the quasi-personal character of the Demiurge. It is the Demiurge, taken as creator of the cosmos, that supports Philo's creation metaphysics drawn from the Old Testament. In addition, and against the Stoic doctrine of cosmic renewal unconnected with providence, the providence of the divine creator is also manifested in judgment of the wicked and the potential destruction of the cosmos.

Lévy examines Philo's De aeternitate mundi for its use of Stoic and Platonic material related to the question of the eternity or creation of the cosmos. In particular, Lévy argues that in this work Philo aims to refute Stoic physics. He does this by making Platonism the philosophical expression of the truth that Moses received from God. Since God or the Demiurge is good, it is not possible that he is the source of the universal conflagrations posited by the Stoics. Having made the world, if God destroyed it or, what amounts to the same thing, if he had given up governance of it, he would have had actually demonstrated an ignorance of what is good for himself. According to Philo, the Stoics must either abandon the very idea of a materialistic theology, or if they insist on retaining theological doctrine, it must be somehow assimilated to Platonism.

The paper by Sterling treats an unusual topic for the subject of this volume, namely, the Septuagint Old Testament Wisdom of Solomon, written sometime between the middle of the first century BCE and the middle of the first century CE. It is a work written in Greek and intended for the Jewish Greek Diaspora, utilizing Greek philosophy to give the most favorable expression possible of Jewish doctrine. The work uses both Stoic and Platonic material unapologetically. Sterling attempts to assess the philosophical commitments of the author of this work as well as his understanding of post-Hellenistic philosophy generally. He considers a number of texts which clearly show that the author is inclined to mine Platonic doctrine to the extent that it can be put to the service of Hellenized Judaism. The author of the Wisdom of Solomon is even willing to use the language of Stoic physics to explain Biblical miracles, raising the intriguing question of what then remains of the miraculous. Most strikingly, the author of the work considers the attributes of an anthropomorphized Wisdom, which bear comparison to Cleanthes' Hymn to Zeus. But for the author, Wisdom is an intermediary between God and humanity, equivalent to the Philonic Logos or to a Platonic Demiurgic deity, not the first principle of all represented by the Stoic Zeus.

A.A. Long is concerned with the question of whether or how Plato and Platonism affected Stoic philosophy in the period covered by this book. In particular, he examines the ambiguities of mind/body dualism in Plato and in the Stoicism of Seneca and Epictetus, arguing that both philosophers alter their accounts of dualism according to their commitment to physicalism. As Long nicely puts it, in Epictetus the contrast is between the carnal and the spiritual, not as in Plato between two substances, the physical and the non-physical. Thus, Epictetus can explore the relationship between mind and body as an ethical question, not a metaphysical one. Generally, Long argues, Stoicism from its inception embraced a form of dualism with definite Platonic echoes and overlapping images, but without its immaterialism. The mind for Stoics is unqualifiedly corporeal, albeit of the most refined sort, though it is not, as in Epicureanism, an emergent property of the body. It is no doubt the shared ethical orientation of Stoicism and Platonism with respect to the superiority of the mind to the body that later Platonists found easy to appreciate at the same time as they rejected the underlying physicalism.

The paper by Stowers is another unusual one for such a book. It focuses on the use of philosophical terms and concepts by Paul of Tarsus of the New Testament, in particular those of Platonism and Stoicism. Stowers argues that Paul in his letters draws on Platonic doctrine in his moral psychology along with a Stoic-like role for pneuma, variously construed as wind or air or breath, as constituting the substance of the divine. Human mental pneuma is an inferior version of divine pneuma and Platonic assimilation to divinity is construed by Paul as the refining of the former into the latter. This is not, as Stowers, emphasizes, the separation of the intelligible from the sensible, but an indication of a cosmic hierarchy of substance, more Stoic than Platonic. According to Stowers, Paul's mission to bring the Gospel to non-Jews was promoted in the currency of Stoic and Platonic ideas. He sought to give an account of divinization decidedly more Stoic than Platonic in its anthropomorphism and rejection of a rigorously non-sensible realm. So, at the core of Christian doctrine we find a Stoicizing Platonism, something anticipated by Antiochus of Ascalon, a figure who looms in the background of this book.

Inwood presents the most radical proposal in the book. He argues that the universal categorization of Musonius Rufus as a Stoic "in the strong sense" is based on insufficient evidence. By this Inwood means that the views of Musonius cannot be taken as indicative of Stoicism in the first century CE. Considering the evidence, including testimonia, Inwood claims that, though there is Stoic language in Musonius, this is also true for self-declared non-Stoics like Philo. And though Musonius says many things that a Stoic would endorse, it is also the case that Epicureans, Cynics, Platonists, and Peripatetics could share these views. Moving on to a survey of Musonius' Discourses, Inwood discovers nothing that is distinctively Stoic, though there is much on which a Stoic would concur. Inwood speculates that the attribution of a Stoic connection to Musonius is owing largely to his having been the teacher of the unqualifiedly Stoic Epictetus and to his having influenced the Stoic Marcus Aurelius. Inwood's interesting conclusion, then, is that Musonius was perhaps the first "philosophically educated public intellectual" (though see above the paper by Hatzimichali on Arius Didymus).

The paper by Attridge follows the theme of the conference from which this book is derived by showing that the development of philosophy in the first century CE from a dominant position of Stoicism to a dominant position of Platonism is, at least in part, owing to Jewish and then, most prominently, Christian appropriation of ancient Greek philosophy for theological epistemology. Platonism, Attridge argues, provided better conceptual tools than did Stoicism for explaining how we can have cognitive access to the transcendent. In particular, Philo's reflections on the possibility of knowing God, and his conclusion that this is only possible through an intermediary, the divine Logos, consisting of God's actions and words and prophetic revelations, is taken up by Christian writers, first and foremost the author of the fourth Gospel, to articulate the role of the person Jesus in Christian theology. Attridge examines this Gospel, along with some Gnostic texts, to demonstrate the appropriation of Platonic epistemology through Philo by early Christians. The overriding claim is that God has made his true name and so his essence known in the person of Jesus.

Opsomer focuses on Plutarch's reception of Stoic ideas. He aims to show that Plutarch's view of Stoicism is far more positive than his view of Epicureanism and that there are subtle appropriations of the former in Plutarch's philosophy. As Opsomer shows, in theology, moral psychology, and ethics (of primary concern to Plutarch), there was a significant convergence of views between Stoics and Plutarch's version of Platonism. Nevertheless, there was a core disagreement, traceable ultimately to Stoic materialism, that prevented anything like an assimilation of Stoicism to Platonism. Plutarch, in his work On Stoic Self-Contradictions, is primarily engaged with the Old Stoa, and Chrysippus in particular. Plutarch's strategy is to point out contradictions between the theoretical basis of Stoicism, as found in Chrysippus and the practice of Stoicism, presumably among Plutarch's own contemporaries. Plutarch saw Platonism, as he understood it, as much closer to Stoicism than to Epicureanism. The Stoic commitment to the sufficiency of virtue for happiness and divine providence are two fundamental areas in which the Stoics reach more or less correct conclusions though their rationalistic materialism prevents them from getting these exactly right.

The paper by Brittain considers chapter 17 of Alexander of Aphrodisias' Mantissa which contains Alexander's Peripatetic answer to a question about the psychological basis of ethical development. The chapter is cast as a response to the Stoic doctrine of oikeiōsis. Brittain examines in detail Alexander's survey of various Peripatetic views on action and desire and his conclusion that the pros and cons of his predecessors' responses to the Stoics need to be sorted out to arrive at the correct Aristotelian view. What Alexander is seeking is an authentically Aristotelian solution to the problem of the first oikeion. The problem he faces is in accounting for the initial desires of pre-rational children. It is at this point that Alexander takes on the Stoic account of the actions of children who, though not rational, act according to their nature. Brittain represents Alexander as undertaking a 'subordinating appropriation" of the Stoic doctrine of action, especially in the light of post-Hellenistic Peripatetic attempts to counter that.

All in all, these are fine papers on a period of philosophy very difficult to appreciate owing to the paucity of evidence. For example, we know the names of scores of self-declared Platonists from this period about whose views we know nothing. Nevertheless, high-quality collections like this one are contributing to bringing one neglected period of the history of philosophy into the mainstream.