From Valuing to Value: A Defense of Subjectivism

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David Sobel, From Valuing to Value: A Defense of Subjectivism, Oxford University Press, 2016, 312pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712640.

Reviewed by Ben Bramble, Trinity College Dublin


David Sobel's book collects fifteen essays (fourteen reprinted, one new) on subjectivism about value, the view that "things have value because we value them" (1). Sobel has three main goals: to "make [subjectivism] clearer, underline its main strengths and weaknesses, and try to persuade you that the view is genuinely attractive and plausible even after sustained scrutiny" (3). The book is intended as merely the first step on an exciting journey from valuing to value (accordingly, it is depicted on the book's front cover as a small step-ladder leading up into a dazzling but treacherous mountain).

Subjectivism about a particular normative domain holds that normativity in that domain flows from, or has its source in, an individual's "not truth-assessable favoring attitudes" (3). What does this mean? It means that there are certain psychological states that cannot themselves be true or false, states such as "liking, desiring, valuing, preferring, wanting, loving, caring for" (3), and so on, and that these determine what is true in the relevant normative domain. Sobel focuses on two domains: well-being (what is good for one) and normative reasons for action (what one has a reason to do). He emphasises two definitional points. First, subjectivists are concerned to give theories of objective matters -- i.e., of what would actually advance one's interests, or what one in fact has a reason to do, rather than merely what it would be rational to think or do given one's beliefs or evidence. Second, the claim is not merely one of extensional adequacy -- i.e., it is not just that there is a perfect fit between what would fulfill one's desires and the normative facts, but that the former makes the latter true.

While Sobel's book is a defense of subjectivism, it is a remarkably measured one. He admits he has no "magic bullet" (17) argument for subjectivism. Instead, he says, he will "take the messier path of weighing up the advantages and disadvantages of the view" (7). And there are, he stresses, some serious disadvantages. Most importantly, for Sobel, subjectivism implies that "there could be agents who lack any reason to be decent or moral" (8). This he finds "deeply counter-intuitive" (10). Sobel dubs this the 'Amoralism Objection'. He addresses it in "Subjectivism and Reasons to be Moral" (Chapter 1). Here, he argues that the vast majority of us do have subjectivist-friendly reasons to treat all others well. This is because most of us, when fully informed about anyone else's suffering, would want that suffering not to occur. What about those unusual individuals who would not care about others even under idealized conditions? Such individuals, Sobel admits, might have no reason to treat others well. He tries to account for why we might mistakenly feel that they do. It might be, for example, he says, because (i) we have a tendency to think (falsely) that acting morally is always in one's own self-interest, something that almost all of us care about, (ii) we have been programmed by evolution or society to have such intuitions, or (iii) we are getting confused with various legitimate ways in which we might criticise or denounce the individual (for example, by saying she is "mean, nasty, immoral, brutish, horrific, monstrous, inexcusable" (28)). In any event, Sobel says, these individuals are likely to be so unusual that we should not trust our intuitions concerning them.

Not only is Sobel upfront about what he regards as weaknesses of subjectivism, he himself is the author of what is to my mind the most serious objection posed to subjectivism in the last thirty years. In "Full Information Accounts of Well-Being" (Chapter 2), he questions whether desires can be informed in the way subjectivists need them to be if they are to plausibly determine one's well-being. More precisely, Sobel argues that "there are substantive worries about uniting the experience of all lives we could lead into a single consciousness" (65). How does a paper such as this belong in a book defending subjectivism? One of the nice new features of Sobel's book is a postscript to this paper, in which he explains how he is now tempted to reply to this objection. His reply, in brief, is that it is no longer clear to him that subjectivism requires that we be able to "[stuff] so much experience and knowledge into a single consciousness" (66). Instead, it might be sufficient to consider "a series of pair-wise comparisons of possible futures in which not every option need be compared to every other" (12). It might even be possible, he says, that the well-being value of a particular life for someone is determined independently of comparisons with other possible lives for that person. Instead of consulting the agent's preferences between different lives, it might be sufficient to "see to what extent her preferences are satisfied within a life, come up with a number such as 74 percent satisfied, and use that to determine the degree to which she is benefited by that life" (67). Sobel refers to such theories as "isolatable" ones (67).

Sobel's candour and charity to opposing viewpoints is refreshing. It is a standout feature of the book, and of his work more generally.

So, why does Sobel think we should be subjectivists? His account of the right motivation for subjectivism is one of his major contributions. In "Explanation, Internalism, and Reasons for Action" (Chapter 7), he rejects as a sound motivation for subjectivism Bernard Williams's influential idea that "if consideration C grounds a reason for A to φ, it must be that C could motivate A to φ" (160). Reasons, he argues, need not be capable of motivating in this way.

Instead, Sobel suggests, in many chapters, a subjectivist should start by noting that it is incredibly plausible that our desires determine what is good for us, and what we have a reason to do, in matters of mere taste. Why might I have a reason to choose chocolate ice cream over vanilla, whereas you have a reason to go with vanilla? In the normal case, Sobel says, it is just because of our differing desires or preferences. If this is true, then we have some reason to think that desires determine our well-being and reasons in all areas of life. "The reasons provided by desires in matters of mere taste are", he writes, "the thin end of the wedge" (297). If we refuse to go all the way toward subjectivism, we will be left with a theory that looks "ad hoc and fundamentally disunited" (297).

Some have objected to Sobel's claim about the source of our reasons in matters of mere taste by claiming that my reason to go for chocolate over vanilla is not that I now prefer chocolate, but that I would get more enjoyment or pleasure from chocolate. Sobel's reply, first made in "Pain for Objectivists" (Chapter 11), is that on the most plausible account of pleasure, a pleasure is just any feeling that is wanted (in the right sort of way), and so it is just desires that are providing the reasons here.

A different worry for Sobel's account of the right motivation for subjectivism is that subjectivists are committed to saying that it is only one's present desires that provide one's reasons (and so that one's future ice cream enjoyment could provide one with a reason only if one happened now to want enjoyment later on). However, Sobel argues (in "Parfit's Case Against Subjectivism" (Chapter 14)) against such a commitment. Indeed, he says, we should endorse a temporally-neutral subjectivism, on which one's reasons for action at any given time "are responsive to the [informed] concerns of all one's [time-slices]" (292). Such a view, he emphasises, "borrows no objectivist principles about what is worth caring about in the first instance" (286). He concedes that there are problems for such a view raised by past desires. Does a long abandoned childhood desire to drive a fire truck give one a reason now to drive a fire truck? This is implausible. So, it may be best, Sobel suggests, to restrict the reason-providing desires to "now-for-now ones" (294). A further major advantage of temporally-neutral subjectivism, according to Sobel, is that it allows a subjectivist to accommodate the widespread intuition that we each necessarily have a reason to avoid our own future pain, regardless of what we happen to care about right now.

Another major contribution is Sobel's argument that subjectivists are entitled to, and indeed should, "grant authority [just] to idealized . . . attitudes" (3). In Chapter 7, he rejects Williams's basis for a full information requirement, namely, that we all want to be better informed. Our desires, Sobel says, determine what we have a reason to do, not the conditions under which our desires determine what we have a reason to do. What particular account of idealization does Sobel favour? He says subjectivists should appeal just to those preferences that "are responsive to their object as it really is rather than as it is falsely imagined to be" (6). Such an appeal, he argues, is fully consonant with the right motivations for subjectivism, since only such desires "reflect the agent's real evaluative perspective" (6). Once again, there need be no presupposition here "that certain goods are more worthy of the idealized valuing attitude than others" (5).

In making all of these arguments, Sobel develops an extremely innovative and nuanced subjectivism. In my view, Sobel's is probably the most sophisticated defense of subjectivism given to date. That said, I have a number of concerns. First, I am not entirely persuaded by Sobel's response to the Amoralism Objection. When I think of an agent who knows all there is to know about a given innocent, but remains unmoved by her condition or well-being, I am inclined to think that we have here, not some brute to be condemned, but someone who is making a mistake, someone who has either missed something (an evaluative fact) or is responding in an ill-fitting way to their full and accurate appreciation of the evaluative facts. Such an agent fails to care about something that seems in some sense worth caring about. Sobel's response, and indeed his subjectivism more generally, seems to lack the resources to properly account for this intuition.

Second, while Sobel admits that there are objections to subjectivism that he does not consider in this book, he says that the Amoralism Objection is the most serious objection to subjectivism. I doubt this. Here, I think, is an even more serious objection: Suppose I were to conclude that nothing matters, no way the world could go that would be in any way better than or preferable to any other way it could go. It seems that such a belief would entirely extinguish my motivations to live. Or, if I somehow had some desires remaining (or believed that I had some), I would not think that I had any reason to fulfill them. I would think that I was a fool for still having any. And how would I regard others who did not realise that nothing mattered, who were going about their lives with a sense of meaning or purpose? I would think them deluded, blind to the pointlessness of their activity. Subjectivism (or at least, the sort Sobel defends, which appeals to one's rationally contingent nontruth assessable favorings) seems unable to account for this. It seems committed to saying that the reasons of all these beings might be entirely unaffected by the fact that nothing mattered or could go better than anything else. If Sobel's subjectivism were true, it should not matter to me whether anything matters. This seems wrong.

Third, while I was excited to read Sobel's postscript in Chapter 2, it left me wanting more. I wasn't clear on what has changed in Sobel's head such that he now finds the possible solution mentioned in footnote 31 of his paper more promising than he originally did. I remain as pessimistic as the original Sobel that we could construct a tolerably detailed well-being ranking of possible lives for someone out of a series of pair-wise comparisons. More generally, I am deeply concerned that the knowledge we can have of our various options is much less than what we would need on a plausible subjectivism.

Likewise, why is Sobel now more tempted than he originally was by an isolatable version of subjectivism (beyond its ability to overcome the objections in question)? Such isolatable theories seem to me quite inadequate. How can my preferences concerning just how my actual life is going be sufficiently well-informed to count as authoritative if I do not know a heck of a lot about other possible lives I might have led? Incidentally, given Sobel's interest both here and elsewhere (namely, in his contemplated restriction to now-for-now desires mentioned earlier) in Chris Heathwood's views on these topics, it would be interesting to hear more from him on exactly where and why he does not want to go along with Heathwood.[1]

Fourth, it would have been nice to hear more from Sobel on exactly how his "thin edge of the wedge" argument is supposed to go. In Chapter 14, he mentions the argument, promising to flesh it out in future work. In Chapter 1, he says a little more. He writes:

saying that such favoring attitudes sometimes carry authority but only in trivial contexts would . . . be unexplained and mysterious. A tempting explanation for the clear authority of such attitudes in matters of mere taste would be that in such simple cases we have unique access to the relevantly informed favoring attitudes . . . (39).

This is intriguing, but we still await a full spelling out of this most important argument.

Fifth, I am not sold on Sobel's account of our reasons in matters of mere taste. Why (in the normal case) have I a reason to go for chocolate ice cream rather than vanilla? Unlike Sobel, I find it quite plausible to think it is because this flavour would give me the most pleasure, where pleasure is understood as a particular kind of feeling (rather than any feeling whose subject merely happens to want it to be occurring). Sobel writes:

The person who tries to capture reasons of mere taste by appealing to a conception of pleasure divorced from any favoring attitude must offer some account of what pleasure is. Most who appeal to such hedonistic views have offered precious little by way of a positive characterization of pleasure and pain and seem to maintain that this is not a problem for their view (38).

But as I and others have argued, our articulateness as well as our powers of introspection over even our own current phenomenology are seriously limited. It is therefore not a major weakness of this sort of objectivism that we cannot say much about what the feeling of pleasure itself is like.[2]

Sobel also worries that it is hard to see how such a sensation of pleasure could be good for somebody who happened to be indifferent to it. He writes: "Most likely pleasure seemed a uniquely plausible recommendation partially because the vast majority of actual people like it. But of course, in other possible worlds, most people do not like that sensation. What could then be said on behalf of [it]?" (226) But should we expect to have reliable intuitions about creatures so unlike ourselves? Perhaps we feel that beings must have some pro-attitude toward what is good for them only because everyone around here happens to like or want pleasure. Or perhaps it is no coincidence at all that all beings with whom we are acquainted like or want their own pleasure. Perhaps we all like or want our own pleasure because pleasure is the most obviously valuable thing. Why is it so hard to imagine beings who do not want their own pleasure? Perhaps it is because it is hard to imagine beings who are so dense as to not realise the value for them of feeling good.

Each of Sobel's chapters is a gem, and there is not space to discuss all of them here. I want, however, to briefly comment on one other chapter that I have not yet mentioned, "Well-Being as the Object of Moral Consideration" (Chapter 4). Here, Sobel argues against welfarist consequentialism, according to which we should act so as to maximise the well-being of everyone. He argues that a better view is a version of consequentialism (or "quasi-consequentialism" (95)) that respects what he calls "the autonomy principle" -- i.e., the principle which states that the right way to "take people into account morally" is not to promote just a subset of their preferences (the ones that determine their well-being), but "what the agent informedly wants us to promote for her sake" (77). This is a fascinating suggestion, and deserves more attention than it has received so far.

A final considerable virtue of Sobel's book is its many, extremely clear reconstructions of a number of tricky arguments by other leaders in the field, including Christine Korsgaard, Bernard Williams, Wayne Sumner, Michael Smith, John McDowell, Connie Rosati, and Mark Schroeder. His book is worth reading for these alone.

Sobel's essays in this book are some of the finest ever written in moral philosophy. Whatever one's favoured theory of value, I hope we can all agree that this book is an invaluable resource.

[1] For Heathwood's views, see his "Preferentialism and Self-Sacrifice", Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 92 (2011): 18-38, "Desire Satisfactionism and Hedonism" Philosophical Studies (2006): 539-63, and "Desire-Based Theories of Reasons, Pleasure, and Welfare," Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Volume 6, ed. Russ Shafer-Landau, Oxford University Press (2011): 79-106.

[2] See Ben Bramble, "The Distinctive Feeling Theory of Pleasure", Philosophical Studies, (2013), 162 (2): 201-217, and Ben Bramble, "A New Defense of Hedonism about Well-Being", Ergo, an Open Access Journal of Philosophy 3 (2016).