Fundamente der Ethik: Unzeitgemäße typologische und subjectivitätstheoretische Untersuchungen

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Klaus Düsing, Fundamente der Ethik: Unzeitgemäße typologische und subjectivitätstheoretische Untersuchungen, Frommann-Holzboog, 2005, 334pp., € 58.00 (pbk), ISBN 3772823696.

Reviewed by Fabian Freyenhagen, University of Cambridge


This is an ambitious book. Klaus Düsing aims at nothing less than putting ethics on new and, he hopes, securer foundations. And more than that: the foundations he proposes are not our considered judgements or some form of intersubjective agreement, but an idealised form of self-consciousness. Düsing admits that both the search for foundations in ethics and the proposal to look to subjectivity for such foundations are 'untimely' (as is indicated by his subtitle, 'untimely investigations in typology and theory of subjectivity'). However, there is an obvious parallel in Christine Korsgaard's recent attempts to underpin ethics. She also looks to subjectivity, in particular to the structure of our practical identity. Düsing is aware of this parallel and sets out to improve on Korsgaard's account by offering a richer conception of self-consciousness and self-determination than the one he finds in her work. Like Korsgaard, Düsing proceeds very much in a Kantian way. However, his work is closest not so much to the master himself, but to the early works of the first of his German Idealist successors, Johann Gottlieb Fichte (pp. 154, 192). What is striking and interesting about Düsing's approach is his effort to answer some of the criticisms traditionally lodged against the Kantian enterprise of grounding ethics. Thus, there is not only the upward movement of idealising self-consciousness in various steps so as to arrive at a conception of it that can underpin ethics (chapter 3). Rather, there is also the downward movement of showing how this conception of self-consciousness is required for differentiating and deriving the concrete content of the ethics thus grounded (chapter 4). In this way, Düsing wants to show that the upward movement does not result in a 'speculatively constructed thought entity [Gedankending]' (p. 302), but in something that can guide actual practice. Preceding this upward and downward movement is a typology of ethical positions (chapter 1) and a discussion of contemporary ethics (chapter 2). The book ends with a short concluding section, in which Düsing reviews his methodology.

By offering a typology of ethics, Düsing attempts to bring order into what he initially presents as the unstructured manifold of ethical positions. He introduces three dimensions with which ethical positions can be classified. Firstly, ethics as a practical discipline is concerned with the will, and the three core types in ethics can be differentiated according to which aspect of willing they prioritise: either the ethical demands which we face in making up our will (as in deontology), or the ends and goods we aim for (as in Utilitarianism and Eudaimonism), or the dispositions necessary in the agent to facilitate the smooth working of the will (as in virtue ethics). In each case, the two other aspects of willing also play a role, albeit a derivative one. Thus, for example, there is a place in Kant's deontological ethics for virtues and ethical ends, but both of these are grounded in the categorical imperative -- they are what is required for beings such as us to put this imperative into practice (pp. 16-18). Secondly, Düsing suggests that these three core types (deontological, teleological and virtue ethics) are subdivided into different variants by considering at what level they are primarily applied, at the individual or the social level. Thirdly, the different variants within the three core types are further differentiated according to whether they are (a) grounded on empirical considerations, or (b) justified by appeal to reason or metaphysics. For example, Aristotle's ethics is placed in the teleological camp, with a primary emphasis on the individual (and only a supplementary concern for the social level) and with metaphysical foundations. Classical Utilitarianism, in contrast, is presented as another position in teleological ethics, but one which is primarily meant to apply to decisions within the social and political realm, while allegedly resting on an empirical basis. Within this typology, there are some classifications that are a theoretical possibility, but have never been taken up in the literature, such as a deontological ethics on empirical foundations.

There are details of Düsing's typology with which one could disagree (e.g., he seems to overplay the importance which Hegel attached to the community vis-à-vis the individual). However, taken as a whole, it seems a reasonable and fairly standard typology. It does not really add anything to Düsing's overall project of finding new foundations for ethics, but it is of some interest in its own right.

In chapter 2, Düsing discusses in breathtaking speed all of the following: a number of contemporary deontologists, the basic approaches in Utilitarianism, some recent work on virtue ethics, and scientific accounts of ethical behaviour. Most of this discussion is not directly necessary for his overall project, and given the limited space in which he treats these topics, it would have been better to leave out some and spend more time on the remaining ones. This is especially so, since some of his criticisms, especially of Utilitarianism, seem just to beg the question outright -- a tendency which also affects Düsing's critical comments accompanying his typology in chapter 1. Düsing always relies on a particular and strongly Kantian conception of what ethics consists in and then faults every other view for not conforming to this model. Thus, for example, all views which deny, or fail to imply, that ethical principles have universal validity are presented as not really ethical and dismissed for this reason alone; and the same holds true for views which want to build ethics on self-interested premises (e.g., pp. 11, 21, 47, 70, 79f, 83ff). Similarly, theories, such as Utilitarianism, which do not accept that persons have absolute rights are criticised just because of this (pp. 89, 96ff), but without further argumentation for why we should assign persons such rights. For this reason, the critical discussion in the first two chapters is often rather uninformative and uncharitable. Admittedly, Düsing goes on to try to show that his kind of Kantian ethics is defensible. However, before this project has been undertaken, his complaints do not add up to much, and even if it were (successfully) undertaken, this would not settle the matter -- Düsing seems to simply assume that showing his ethics to be defensible shows it to be superior.

The crux of the matter, hence, lies in the last two chapters, and especially the third chapter, in which Düsing presents his account of the new foundation for ethics. His strategy in this is as follows: starting from everyday experience and the phenomenology of our own self-consciousness, Düsing introduces a number of models of self-consciousness. These models are meant to be ideal types (in Weber's sense). They vary in their degree of idealisation and are hierarchically organised. In other words, in listing these models Düsing progressively strips away more and more of the contingent and concrete elements of our self-conscious experience. Ultimately, this supposedly results in the highest such model of self-consciousness, which can then be used to furnish a foundation for ethics (I say more on this last step shortly). Düsing claims that this foundation is non-empirical because of the progressive idealisation involved in generating the ultimate model of self-consciousness. At the same time, it does not imply a conception of the self as existing outside the world of experience (such as Kant's transcendental self). The validity of the ultimate model of self-consciousness extends to all possible empirical persons, but makes neither a claim beyond them, nor is meant to constitute an ontological account of the self.

Düsing presents his models of self-consciousness in inverse hierarchical order, starting from the one closest to everyday experience. Preceding self-consciousness is mere consciousness, and the two should be kept apart, since no animals, but only human beings have self-consciousness. We first encounter self-consciousness as the minimum awareness of ourselves which accompanies all of our perceptions while we are awake (the 'phenomenological horizon-model'; pp. 135f). On the basis of this arises the first form of self-consciousness in which the self is itself the direct object of consciousness, such as finding oneself to be in a certain mood (pp. 136f). This is the second model of self-consciousness. More complex still (and now requiring the use of language) is the ascription of properties to oneself, and this operation characterises the third model of self-consciousness (pp. 138f). Next is the 'reflection model'. Here, the distinguishing feature is that we identify with the property or attribute which we ascribed to ourselves (pp. 139-141). (Incidentally, Düsing claims that it is at this level that Korsgaard's analysis remains (p. 72), missing the further complexity which he introduces.) This self-identification is heightened and completed in the next step, the 'epistemic intentionality-model', which is the fifth model of self-consciousness. At this stage, we order all our properties and attributes into a coherent whole, as if we viewed ourselves from the perspective of writing our autobiography (pp. 141-143). This ordering requires the construction of a 'life-plan [Lebensplan]' (or overall aim and identity for our life), and this in turn requires a further, the sixth, model of self-consciousness. Düsing calls it the model of 'voluntative self-determination' (pp. 143-146). And it is this model that is the highest idealisation of the self-consciousness for Düsing.

The next step in Düsing's argument is to consider the model of voluntative self-determination further. When constructing a plan or identity for our life, we are aware that we are constrained by our finitude. We cannot realise all possible projects or identities, but need to make a choice amongst them. Yet, while we are thus constrained to choose, we think of ourselves as being free to choose any of the options and thereby to freely form an overall aim for our life. In fact, on this model we cannot but ascribe freedom to ourselves, whether or not we are justified to do so. (In effect, Düsing here follows Kant's discussion of freedom in Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Part III.) We cannot think of ourselves as agents and as giving life-plans to ourselves unless we think of ourselves as free; but that we think this does not prove that we really are free (pp. 174-177). A proof of freedom is both impossible and unnecessary. The only thing required is that freedom cannot be disproved by theoretical enquiries, and Düsing claims that this is indeed so (pp. 177ff). (He partly relies here on his rejection of scientific reductionism found in chapter 2 and mentioned above). In particular, he proposes a multi-level conception of freedom. According to this conception, the lower levels of freedom are directly compatible with natural causality (e.g., we often have a variety of instinctive reactions open to us); and the higher ones are part of a mental domain which is irreducible to the physical domain (pp. 170-174).

With this conception of freedom in place, Düsing turns to ethical foundations. Here is a brief reconstruction of how the argument seems to go: by thinking of myself as free, I can self-determine myself to follow a particular life-plan. This does not mean that I will always act with this plan directly in my mind. Nor does it mean that I will be able to fully put it into practice. Yet, with a further idealising step, this conception of myself as freely self-determining gives rise to the conception of a pure practical subject, which is free of such limitations. Now, this pure practical subject is devoid of any concrete content. However, the pure practical subject is not completely detached from the concrete selves either. The reason for this is that it has been generated by progressive idealisation of concrete selves and their self-consciousness. And as a consequence, the pure practical self still contains some elements of these concrete selves, namely, those elements which are essential. One of these essential elements is that all experience and acts depend on a context of intersubjectivity. From this element follows an important aspect of pure practical subjectivity, namely, a 'primordial being-with [ursprüngliches Mitsein]'. By this Düsing seems to mean that in making sense of one's own self-consciousness one always has to already assume that one is one person among many. And here we come to the last step of Düsing's argument (at least as far as I can make sense of it): it is because the being-with is carried over into the conception of the pure practical subject that this conception implies the 'noematic content' of an ideal ethical community of such pure practical subjects (e.g. p. 159). This rational content of the conception of pure practical subjectivity consists in the recognition of other persons as pure practical subjects and the respect for them that allegedly follows from this. The thought here presumably is as follows: we attach value to our ability to freely self-determine ourselves, which we can ascribe to ourselves qua pure practical subject; and we are also required to attach the same value to others once we recognise them as pure practical subjects, since qua such subjects we do not differ from one another. In this way, the content and idea of an ideal ethical community directly derives from our conception of ourselves as freely determining and thereby pure practical self. Both of these elements, the conception of pure practical subjectivity and its noematic content of an ideal ethical community, can then be used to furnish the foundation of ethics -- as the downward movement in chapter 4 aims to demonstrate.

The main point in chapter 4 is that the conception of pure practical subjectivity and its noematic content of an ideal ethical community face the concrete selves in the form of a command, namely, the unconditional command to arrange their intentions, decisions and acts so as to realise the ideal ethical community (pp. 191f, 249). This general obligation is then applied to a number of concrete contexts, and in this way specific duties are derived. (Note that Düsing does not claim that these duties are already contained in the general obligation to further an ideal ethical community, and, hence, he leaves it open that full moral consciousness needs to develop historically (pp. 197f) -- a nod in the direction of Hegel.) On the basis of this primarily deontological outlook, Düsing then finds a place both for virtues, on the one hand, and ends and goods, on the other. He also uses this outlook to differentiate between a variety of virtues and ends. In all of this, he claims to be using the conception of the self as freely self-determining and its content of an ideal ethical community as grounding and structuring devices. This is most explicit in his derivation of virtues such as courage and mercifulness [Barmherzigkeit] (pp. 236ff, 243ff).

Düsing also shows that an ethics developed on the basis of his proposed foundation will have its primary application at the individual level (pp. 271ff). This is unsurprising, since his foundation strategy is to build on what is implied by the models of self-consciousness of the individual self. However, Düsing also points to the manifold practical implications of his ethics at the social level (pp. 276ff).

Finally, Düsing suggests that his non-empirical grounding of ethics does not preclude that people can be practically moved by such an ethics. The ethical demands can have a foothold in us via the cultivation of virtues, which for Düsing are the 'physical incarnation of ethical freedom' (p. 298). He neglects, however, to explain how it is possible for us to effect this foothold of ethics in ourselves. Kant could remain silent about this for principled reasons. For him this question concerns the relationship between the transcendental and empirical self, about which we cannot gain knowledge. Düsing, on the other hand, does not have such principled reason for silence on this matter and, hence, owes us an explanation. This notwithstanding, chapter 4 presents us with a rich account of what an ethical system would look like, if one accepted Düsing's foundations.

One might want to disagree with some of the specific details of this ethical system (e.g., it is rather odd to count justice among the 'psycho-physical virtues'; pp. 240ff). However, let me instead end with one of the more fundamental worries that could be raised about Düsing's project.

To see the force of the worry, consider the following question: why should we think that we need a foundation for ethics? While Düsing never directly addresses this question, there are two considerations operative in his thinking. Firstly, he claims that we could make headway in applied ethics only if such foundations were available -- otherwise, the issues in this field could not be settled once and for all (pp. 305f). Secondly, in general we would not be able to account for the necessity and universality of ethical commands without such foundations (e.g., p. 149). This highlights Düsing's specifically Kantian perspective: the question is not whether a moral theory which lays down universal and necessary commands is the right way to think about ethics, but how such a view of ethics is possible. No independent support for this Kantian perspective is given, apart from the claim that it is a datum of common consciousness that morality consists in universal and necessary commands.

However, even if one accepted this perspective and wanted merely to settle how such an ethics was possible, Düsing's account is unsatisfactory. If a moral sceptic asked why he should follow moral demands, he would be rather unimpressed by the answer that the idealisation of his self-consciousness gave rise to these demands. Why should he care about that? What sort of contradiction or inconsistency would the sceptic be guilty of, and how grave a mistake would it be to ignore it? Presumably, the charge would be that the sceptic is inconsistent in valuing only his own self-determination, and that this inconsistency strikes to the heart of his agency. However, it is far from clear that there is an inconsistency here. There is a notorious gap between accepting that my own self-determination is of value to me and others' self-determination is of value to them, on the one hand, and me valuing their self-determination, on the other. I can come to recognise that valuing for me and valuing for them has the same structure, but it does not automatically follow that I should assign the same value to them (parallel concerns apply to Korsgaard's account).

Moreover, consider someone who did not value his own self-determination, someone who either did not care about having a life-plan, or found it a burden to adopt one. Such a person could act against Düsing's ethics while avoiding the charge of inconsistency. Düsing could hardly say that they should value their self-determination, given that such valuing is meant to be the ground of any demands on them. To say that they cannot avoid having a life-plan would not help either, since it is not the life-plan itself that matters, but the value allegedly attached to our ability to form one. Perhaps, the reply would be that it is impossible not to value self-determination; whatever we do, we cannot but value it. It is not obvious that this is the case, and even if it were, one might not want to assign too much normative weight to this. If it were a matter of psychological necessity, then it is not clear that we should build ethics on this foundation (it would align it too closely to the compulsions of madmen); if it is a conceptual necessity that we have to value our own self-determination, then it is unclear why this should carry any ethical (or motivational) force.

Finally, Düsing could not just dismiss the challenge of the sceptic as irrelevant. He wants to show that his proposed foundations give rise to ethical duties that necessarily hold for everyone. Thus, for him the sceptic is a live worry, and I am not convinced that he can answer this worry. At the very least, Düsing needs to say much more on these matters to make his project convincing.

Düsing has presented us with a full-fledged ethical theory of a kind that is very uncommon today; he aims at providing a foundation for ethics and to build a complete ethical system on that basis. I have my doubts whether this is possible, or even desirable, but Düsing's account needs to be reckoned with. There is much to be gained from engagement with this book, especially with its last two chapters.