Future Pasts: The Analytic Tradition in Twentieth-Century Philosophy

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Floyd, Juliet and Shieh, Sanford, eds., Future Pasts: The Analytic Tradition in Twentieth-Century Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2001, 480 pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-513916-X.

Reviewed by Avrum Stroll, University of California, San Diego


This collection of essays is dedicated to the late Burton Dreben (1927-1999). Each of its twenty-one contributors was a colleague or a student of Dreben’s during the years he taught at Harvard and at Boston University. The editors indicate in their dedicatory statement that all the essays are written, at least partially, in reaction to Dreben’s belief that the evolution of the analytic tradition represents a noble but failed effort to achieve scientific clarity about the nature of philosophy, and that precisely because of its failures, it is the most profound of twentieth-century philosophical movements. Dreben conceived of this movement as beginning with the logical writings of Frege and Russell, and as ending with the philosophies of the later Wittgenstein and Quine, who in strikingly different ways saw the attempts of philosophy to achieve the rigor and substantive content of science as misguided. The twenty-one contributors, in alphabetical order, are: Stanley Cavell, Juliet Floyd, Dagfinn Føllesdal, Michael Friedman, Warren Goldfarb, W.D. Hart, Gary Hatfield, Jaakko Hintikka, Peter Hylton, Edward H. Minar, Susan Neiman, Rohit Parikh, Charles Parsons, Hilary Putnam, W.V. Quine, John Rawls, Thomas Ricketts, Gerald E. Sacks, Naomi Scheman, Sanford Shieh, and Joan Weiner.

As one might expect from such a distinguished coterie, most of the essays are interesting—though with the exception of a splendid, lengthy reminiscence by John Rawls and a brief postscript by Stanley Cavell, each written in 1997 or two years before Dreben died, they do not specifically focus on Dreben or his work. The assessments by Rawls and Cavell of Dreben as a person, colleague and teacher are remarkably the same. Here, in part, is what Cavell says about him:

He was the first instance I recognized as satisfying a concept I acquired my entering year at Harvard, that of the famous graduate student. His fame rested—already—on the combination of an achievement of a result in logic together with a reputation for remarkable skills and standards of textual interpretation (including but not confined to texts in the history of analytic philosophy). Because, in addition, of his generosity as a teacher—he would, for example, hold concentrated logic scrimmages for those preparing for the annual death-defying twelve-hour games of the old Ph.D. written preliminary examinations—it was to him that I would sometimes submit the more questionable of my exercises in coming to terms with the dispensation of philosophy so formidably represented at Harvard. I remember particularly the long paper I had prepared for J. L. Austin on the occasion of his residence at Harvard for the spring semester of 1955 to offer the William James Lectures. The paper was entitled “The Theatricality of Everyday Life,” itself indicating that, while full of Austin-inspired examples, it was not your ordinary analytic fare. Burt’s timely response, after making it clear that he understood what I was after (accomplished, however else, by drawing the moral of certain of my purplish passages), was to say something like: “You’re right to hold out for these effects of understanding. But there will be consequences. Not everyone is going to see that there is rigor here; it is not of an accustomed kind.” The setting of these words, or ones close to them, I recall was a walk through Harvard Yard, which has not changed much in the more than forty years since they were uttered. Neither has my gratitude for them.
I never assumed that later such occasions would uniformly prove to be so encouraging; Burt could also be harsh (p.358).

Most of the essays are clearly and carefully argued, and because that is so, it is impossible to discuss any of them in the detail that it deserves. Instead, I wish to make some comments about the collection itself. Unfortunately, these are mostly negative. I begin with the two titles: Future Pasts, an oxymoron that I do not understand and that the editors do not explain, and The Analytic Tradition in Twentieth-Century Philosophy. This subtitle I find misleading for a number of reasons. One might have expected that either the editors, or at least some of the essayists, would have provided a synoptic account of the main subjects addressed by analytic philosophers in the past century. But the introduction begins by discussing how difficult it is to provide an accurate historical narrative of a period when one is still so close to its formative elements, and then in anacoluthic fashion, turns to a lengthy description of each of the papers. Since the essays are heterogeneous, both topically and chronologically, no overriding picture of the analytic tradition emerges from this assemblage.

There is a second difficulty. Looking back at the period that begins with Frege’s Begriffschrift of 1879 and comes down to the present, one can make a plausible case that its most important contribution was the creation of mathematical logic. Nothing like it previously existed, although, as I.M. Bochenski and Benson Mates have argued, there were rudimentary anticipations of it in Stoic logic. Both the editors and many of the authors recognize the importance of this new form of logic. Yet they tend to concentrate mostly on Frege per se and less on its subsequent influence. In my view, mathematical logic had an enormous impact on twentieth-century philosophy per se. It gave rise to two broad streams that might be called “formalist” and “informalist” traditions, respectively. They existed contemporaneously for most of the century, in a relationship that was both symbiotic and adversarial, and chiefly differed over the question of how philosophy should best be done.

The formalists thought that philosophical difficulties could be articulated and then solved by invoking the regimented languages found in Begriffschrift and in Principia Mathematica, or their analogues. The standards of rigor, clarity, and the ability to expose ambiguities characteristic of such ideal languages were regarded as models to be emulated. To this approach the formalists added an empiricist philosophy based on science. Russell described the formalist ideal as “a scientific philosophy grounded in mathematical logic.” By way of contrast, informalists believed that philosophical problems do not arise in formal languages but in everyday contexts and are best dealt with by appealing to the “logic” embodied in ordinary speech. The main exponents of the formalist tradition (the list is hardly exhaustive) in roughly chronological order are Frege, Russell, the early Wittgenstein, Tarski, Gödel, Carnap (and the logical positivists generally), Popper, Hempel, Goodman, Quine, Ayer, Davidson, Marcus, Dummett, Hintikka, Putnam, Kripke and David Lewis. The main figures in the informalist camp are G.E. Moore, the later Wittgenstein, Ryle, H. L. A. Hart, Austin, Malcolm, Grice, Chisholm, Strawson, Vendler, and Searle. Neither the introduction by Floyd and Shieh nor any of the twenty-one essays speaks about the informalist tradition at all. In my view this is a serious omission if the point of the book is fully to describe the analytic tradition in the twentieth-century.

Instead, in this collection we have more or less unorganized bits and pieces about the formalist tradition. Except for occasional passing references to Moore and the later Wittgenstein, and with the exception of a detailed and compelling analysis of Searle’s Chinese Room puzzle by Rohit Parikh, none of the figures of the ordinary language tradition is mentioned. Such important developments as Speech Act Theory, modal logic, Moore’s defense of the common-sense view of the world, or such Wittgensteinian notions as language games and family resemblance are not touched on or are given short shrift. Not even the celebrated theory of descriptions—that “paradigm of philosophy” as Frank Ramsey called it—and which is common to both traditions is alluded to. None of the essays deals with Philosophical Investigations, or the post P.I. writings such as Zettel and On Certainty, which are arguably philosophically more significant than the Tractatus. Also missing is any discussion of a set of mainstream problems whose history begins with the Greeks: Our Knowledge of the External World, Skepticism, Free Will, Other Minds, and so forth. These are issues with which the informalists were concerned and their omission from this volume is a serious lacuna.

The twenty-one essays mostly deal with historical personages such as Frege and Russell, but they tend to concentrate on particular aspects of the work of these thinkers rather than on the broader issues they addressed. Juliet Floyd’s excellent contribution, for example, is entitled “Number and Ascriptions of Number in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus.” Similar remarks may be made about most of the other essays, such as Michael Friedman’s “Tolerance and Analyticity in Carnap’s Philosophy of Mathematics” and Thomas Ricketts’ “Truth and Propositional Unity in Early Russell.” Because of its myopic character, this is not a book that is likely to be useful for the general reader or even for most graduate students in philosophy. Its main appeal will be to specialists who will find in many of these essays detailed and informative expositions of various aspects of the writings of some of the important figures in the formalist tradition.

Let me turn now to a third difficulty. Though the editors emphasize the need to read the history of analytic philosophy without ideological preconceptions and with sensitivity, their introduction sometimes misrepresents the impact that certain philosophers had upon their successors. This is particularly true of what they say about Frege. On page 6, they claim that Frege’s conception of the universal applicability of modern mathematical logic and its singular role in displaying the structure of genuinely objective judgment were the primary concerns of much of twentieth-century philosophy. As they write:

Frege’s Begriffschrift opened philosophers up to the question of whether philosophical arguments about the nature and structure of objectivity and truth were to be held to the standards of rigor set by Frege’s own formalization of logic. Could all philosophical arguments be formally represented in this new language?

These, and other comments they make suggest that from the time Begriffschrift was first published it had a discernible impact on subsequent philosophy. The fact is that Frege’s work, including even such later books as Grundlagen and Grundgeseztze, was either unknown to, or was largely ignored, by his contemporaries. In a footnote in Grundgezetze, for example, he laments: “In vain do we seek notice of my Grundlagen der Arithmetik in the Jahrbuch über die Fortschritte der Mathematik. Researchers in the same area, Dedekind, Otto Stolz, von Helmholtz, seem not to be aware of my works. And Kronecker fails to mention them in his essay on the concept of number.” Grundgeseze is Frege’s chef d’oeuvre, the culmination of nearly two decades of research into the foundations of mathematics. Yet, during the first decade of its existence, it was to be reviewed only once (by G. Peano in 1895) and was to wait until 1915 for a partial translation into English by P. Jourdain, and even today no complete translation of it exists in English. Russell, more than any other person, was responsible for keeping Frege’s name before the public during the period 1903-1920. The flowering of Frege’s reputation occurred only after World War II and my guess is that this was primarily due to Carnap. In Meaning and Necessity (1947), Carnap developed a semantical system based on Grundgesetze and “Uber Sinn und Bedeutung.” In that monograph, Frege’s ideas were lucidly and carefully presented to philosophers in this country for the first time, and my conjecture is that Frege’s subsequent widespread influence on the analytic tradition begins from this date. The editors of Future Pasts suggest a continuing Fregean influence from the original publication of Begriffschrift. We have here, I regret to say, the chronological misplacing of a recent trend.

There are various errata in this work, including numerous typographical and editorial infelicities. I will mention, quickly, only three. On page 10, the editors write: “But the positivists also held that ethical utterances are not verifiable, and so do not express genuine propositions, are neither true nor false.” This statement is mistaken. In Fragen der Ethik (1930) Moritz Schlick, the founder of Der Wiener Kries, argued that moral judgments are capable of being true or false. In the Bibliography of Future Pasts (p. 439) the date given for the publication of P.M.S. Hacker’s Wittgenstein’s Place in Twentieth-Century Analytic Philosophy is 1997; the correct date is 1996. On page 409, in the Notes to Gary Hatfield’s paper, “Rorty on Descartes and Locke,” reference 15 follows reference 12 and precedes 13.

Despite the preceding criticisms, I think this book contains a large number of first-rate articles. Among them there is a short but brilliant piece by W.V. Quine, “Confessions of a Confirmed Extensionalist.” The editors do not indicate when this essay was written, and even after an intensive bibliographical search, I cannot find it listed as having been previously published. It would be interesting to know where they found it, and whether it was expressly written for this volume. In this paper Quine is at his wittiest and at his most paradoxical. It begins with the sentences, “I am neither an essentialist, nor, so far as I know, an existentialist. But I am a confirmed extensionalist.” In this six-page endeavor, Quine defends an extensionalist approach to the philosophy of language against the usual intensionalist objections to his view. I don’t think he is successful—but he is clever, and for that reason alone the essay is well worth perusing.