Gabriel Marcel's Ethics of Hope: Evil, God and Virtue

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Jill Graper Hernandez, Gabriel Marcel's Ethics of Hope: Evil, God and Virtue, Continuum, 2011, 156pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441196279.


Reviewed by Steven G. Affeldt, Le Moyne College


Marcel was among the astonishing generation of French intellectuals and artists born between roughly 1890 and 1910 that included Sartre, Levinas, de Beauvoir, Kojève, Lacan, Camus, Merleau-Ponty, Ionesco, Artaud, and Bataille. Like many of them, Marcel was both highly prolific and committed to producing work that could maintain its intellectual rigor while engaging a wide audience. In addition to more than a dozen major philosophical works, Marcel wrote over thirty dramatic pieces, scores of essays of criticism, and a number of musical compositions. However, while he was admired by the philosophical luminaries of his milieu and has always enjoyed a circle of devoted followers, Marcel is among the least celebrated and studied members of this illustrious set.

Given the richness, depth, and lucidity of his work, one can't help but suspect that this is, at least to a large extent, a matter of his failing to fit the prevailing intellectual fashions during the heyday of the reception of existentialist thought. Marcel's emphasis on hope and transcendence clashed with the appetite for studies of meaninglessness, despair, and ennui. His commitment to Catholic Christianity was equally out of step with those celebrating the death of God and those turning toward Eastern spirituality. But whatever its causes, Marcel's relative neglect and obscurity are unfortunate, and Jill Graper Hernandez's monograph represents a welcome addition to Marcelian scholarship.

If we understand Marcel's relative neglect as a function of his having been out of step with his times, Hernandez opens her book with the suggestion that he may be especially relevant today. The "contemporary landscape of war, economic turmoil, and the increased dependence on technological innovation," she notes, may inspire a "resurgence of philosophical interest" in Marcel since his "body of work . . . suggests that a meaningful life can emerge out of a broken, objectified world" (p. 1). And, indeed, Hernandez points out that four major works by Marcel -- Awakenings, Creative Fidelity, The Mystery of Being, and Thou Shalt Not Die -- have been returned to print and that important studies of his metaphysics and epistemology have recently appeared. However, Hernandez notes, "expansive and important applications of Marcel's thought have not been made in the area of ethics" (p. 1), and this is what her book aims to provide.

Hernandez's book has four main aims. First, it argues that all of Marcel's philosophical work is shaped by, and directed toward, concerns that are fundamentally ethical in character so that his "existentialism is essentially moral" and "primarily normative" (p. 2). Second, it sketches the character of Marcel's ethics and argues that "it is only through [this] ethics of hope that evil . . . can be overcome" (p. 1). Third, it aims to show the practical value and applicability of Marcel's ethics by illustrating how it may inform concrete responses to three contemporary issues: the increasing hegemony of technology, war and authoritarian regimes, and poverty and unemployment. And fourth, it argues that Marcel's ethics has important affinities with various trends within analytic ethics -- specifically with Amartya Sen's welfarism and Nel Noddings' feminist ethics of care -- and so may serve as "a bridge between existential and analytic ethics" (p. 2).

While each of these aims is important for Hernandez, they do not receive anything like equal attention. In fact, the aim of suggesting ways in which Marcel's work may link existential and analytic ethics is given hardly more than a few passing glances and the aim of showing how a Marcelian ethics may meet concrete contemporary issues is only addressed in the final chapter. Four of the book's five chapters are largely devoted to the first two aims, and this is where it is especially valuable.

To get a closer look at some aspects of her discussion, it is useful to begin with a characterization of Marcel's thought that Hernandez does not herself employ. In particular, much of Marcel's philosophical oeuvre may be understood as structured by a dynamic of restlessness and craving for peace akin to that which governs Augustine's Confessions. For Marcel, the human being is fundamentally defined by what he calls ontological exigence, a drive toward transcendence that expresses human separation from God and the fact of living in a "broken world." In modernity, however, this exigence is, for the most part, not recognized as such. Rather, it is experienced as an amorphous sense of unease that, in line with what Marcel regards as dominant modern categories, is reduced to a "problem" regarding one or more of the "functions" that modernity takes to define both things and persons. For Marcel, this reduction of exigence to the status of a "problem" is typical of modernity's denial of mystery and its conviction that all "problems" can, eventually, be clearly and completely grasped and, through the use of reason (management, organization, institutions, engineering, technology, etc.), definitively solved or resolved. However, Marcel argues that efforts to "solve" the "problem" of ontological exigence are profoundly destructive. They fuel and intensify modernity's ubiquitous materialistic and functional stance, and that stance, according to Marcel, renders both persons and things devoid of meaning and value while producing a pervasive despair (even if it is not recognized as such).

In the opening two chapters, Hernandez illustrates this dynamic relationship among exigence, problem, functional materialism, the destruction of meaning and value, and the spread of despair, arguing that "reducing the significance of human existence in the universe to the realm of the problem is doomed to failure" (p. 5) and that "when our existence as humans is ground down to a formula solvable by some system, we will ultimately come to despair" (p. 6).

In chapter one she focuses on how this dynamic is driven by, and also structures, the individual's relation to his/her body. She notes that, for Marcel, the "only existential indubitable is the self-incarnate in a body and thereby manifest to the world" (p. 14). In fact, Marcel was among the first modern philosophers to approach the body as "the primary focus of existence" (p. 18), and this dimension of his work systematically informed that of Merleau-Ponty. However, rather than recognizing himself as essentially embodied and appreciating that the body is "the means and medium by which" (p. 14) he exists and is involved with the world and others, the "problematic man [i.e., the modern individual who approaches existence as a 'problem' to be solved] sees the body as an object that he has, a machine that allows him to move about . . . in the world" (p. 15). For Marcel, this tendency to regard the body as a thing that one "has" is a manifestation of the functional relation to the world (and others) endemic within modernity. In this connection, Hernandez quotes a 1964 article by Rudolph Gerber to good effect:

Utensils and functions have so dominated the thinking of contemporary society that specialists see themselves not as persons but as functions . . . As man becomes his function, his body becomes a tool . . . Man becomes a product of his efforts to produce. As he reduces himself from what he essentially is to what he does, the deep reaches of human living available to integral individuals recede, and life becomes shallow. (p. 20)

It is important not to miss the depth of this Marcelian charge that life becomes shallow. The idea is not simply that life becomes trivial and insipid; one may, indeed, be engaged in matters of great moment (Marcel frequently invokes the development of the atomic bomb). Rather, the idea is that materialistic functionalism treats all of Being as a set of facts that stand in merely instrumental relations to one another and, in so doing, destroys all non-instrumental meaning and value and leaves individuals bereft of any guiding orientation and purpose.

This gloss on life becoming shallow echoes Nietzsche's vision of the death of God, and in chapter two Hernandez continues developing Marcel's critique of problematic man through a very rich discussion of his treatment of this Nietzschean idea. For Marcel, Hernandez argues, the death of God "is not an abstract difficulty, but is a concrete historical and sociological fact of our moral evolution" (p. 48) that is produced by the materialistic functionalism of the problematic man's stance toward being. Accordingly, whether or not one is participating in the death of God is not a matter of one's belief. In fact, Hernandez suggests that theists who construe God as an object of knowledge have a special culpability for God's death since they not only promote an idea of God that plays directly into atheism but also "contribute to the problems facing humanity . . . by undermining the mystery that Marcel thinks underlies the relationship between God and humans" (p. 32). Further, Hernandez argues that, for Marcel, the way in which one responds to the death of God is the defining existential issue for all individuals. "Marcel's position," she writes,

is that for any given individual, regardless of their belief, the death of God presents an unavoidable moral obstacle that must be wrestled with in order for freedom (and then, moral responsibility and virtue) to be able to take hold. The obstacle of the death of God is not something that can be overcome; it is an existential dilemma that can only be struggled over and grappled with until, ultimately, one's life is defined by it. (p. 48)

The first step in the Marcelian ethical life, then, is to recognize one's own participation in the destruction of meaning and value embodied in the death of God. This participation is rooted in one's functional, materialist, and rationalist stance toward existence. Even if this destruction of meaning and value cannot be finally and definitively overcome, Hernandez argues, the lived struggle against it can form the basis for the creation of existential meaning.

Although the divisions are not as neat as my reconstruction suggests, in chapters three and four Hernandez develops an account of Marcel's positive ethical vision -- which is to say an account of Marcel's vision of the nature of this struggle against the death of God and how that struggle may create substantial meaning and ethically transformative hope. It is in this area that much of what is most provocative and challenging in Hernandez's book takes shape, but it is also here that some of its most significant shortcomings emerge.

The basic structure of Marcel's positive view, as Hernandez presents it, may be noted by returning briefly to the comparison with Augustine. For Augustine, famously, the torment and destruction of human restlessness ends, or culminates, in the discovery that "our hearts are restless till they rest in Thee, O Lord." However, as Hernandez presents Marcel, this Augustinian discovery would be recast as the thought that "our hearts are restless till they rest in a 'we'." Throughout her book, Hernandez repeatedly insists that the restlessness and the destructive materialistic functionalism of the problematic man is overcome, or at least combated, in taking "a relational turn -- a turn toward another person and away from the self" (p. 12).

This may be regarded as the central claim of the entire argument of Hernandez's book. It involves one of the most important aspects of her reading of Marcel, not only in arguing that for him relationality is the path beyond materialistic destruction of meaning, but in placing primary importance on relationships with persons or communities. That is, without denying that the telos of Marcelian relationality is fundamentally shaped around devotion to God, Hernandez argues that "the exigent life locates its identity in the self-with-others," and the "emergence of the subject's mindset out of facticity and problematicity into a greater degree of being comes by being in a community which fosters the creation of hope" (pp. 58-59). Hence, she maintains that, for Marcel, "the transcendence of humanity over the material is not theistic, or particularly Christian, but is open to all who respond to it" (p. 53) and "even the atheist can achieve redemption, if redemption is the salvaging of a meaningful existence tied to community and evidenced in a life of hope" (p. 52).

Given Marcel's account of the sources of modernity's pervasive destruction of meaning and value, the suggestion that "redemption" lies in turning toward relationships with others may well seem unpromising. Hernandez herself notes that a "critic might suggest that Marcel is either attempting to provide a formula to extricate someone from existential angst, or that the extrication is too simple" (p. 89). She is right, however, to insist that "neither criticism hits the mark" (p. 89). Rather than representing a facile panacea for nihilism, Marcel's appeal to the power of relationships draws together and rests upon many of the richest veins in his thought, e.g., his ideas of exigence, being, mystery, availability, entrustment, commitment, creative fidelity, and hope. Further, his efforts to show that it is in and through committed relationships that the self is created and that meaning and value are constituted are among the greatest sources of his philosophical relevance, both undergirding powerful challenges to the likes of Sartre and Heidegger and illuminating his affinities with Levinas and, among contemporary analytic philosophers, Frankfurt.

While Hernandez rightly emphasizes the redemptive role that Marcel sees for committed relationships, her discussion of these relationships and of how they may play this role needs more systematic development and further elaboration. For example, she recognizes that, since there are "bad relationships" and "bad attachments" (p. 74), not just any type of relationship or "relational turn" carries redemptive potential. However, although she discusses the interpersonal virtues of fidelity and availability, Hernandez acknowledges that she has not discussed the "necessary and compelling question" of what "constitutes a 'proper attachment'" (p. 142, n. 8).

But this is a more significant omission than she seems to recognize. In fact, it means that she has offered no clear account of what constitutes potentially redemptive relationships and how exactly they differ from those that are destructive. For not only are the virtues of fidelity and availability insufficient to ground this distinction, they also are not virtues in improper and destructive relationships. A similar lack of explicit development diminishes Hernandez's account of exactly how involvement in relationships may be redemptive. For Marcel, fidelity is the critical concept in this regard. He devoted the whole of Creative Fidelity (and much of other works as well) to detailed consideration of the ways in which one's efforts to respond to the exposures, risks, and challenges of maintaining fidelity to another fuel the ongoing creation of the self, establish substantive meaning and value, and, ultimately, inculcate an openness to Being, faith, and mystery. However, although Hernandez recurs to the transformative power of the "relational turn" throughout her book, she devotes only four consecutive pages directly to fidelity. Those pages, rather than explaining how it may be creative, focus primarily upon the problematic man's refusal of fidelity and the costs of that refusal.

These limitations of Hernandez's discussion are significant. However, they (and others like them) are linked to an important and laudable feature of her philosophical manner. As noted at the outset, Marcel energetically resisted the reduction of philosophy to a narrowly academic discipline practiced by cloistered specialists who speak and write in an increasingly arcane jargon. His own writings, therefore, are admirably lucid and reflect his desire to reveal philosophy's broadly human relevance and to engage philosophers and non-philosophers alike. Hernandez clearly embraces these same aspirations and her philosophical manner shares many attributes with Marcel's: she appeals to, and draws upon, the reader's experience and intuitions; she employs concrete examples, familiar idioms, and colloquial expressions; and she openly exposes the situated and engaged position from which her work is written. If, in this case, Hernandez's manner carries the cost of some lack of development and clarity, it also plays an important part in making her book especially suggestive and inviting. Those familiar with Marcel will be provoked to further study, and those unfamiliar with his work will be inspired, and helped, to make its acquaintance.

Note: While Hernandez is probably not responsible for this, the book's editing and production are very poor. For example, Man Against Mass Society is not cited in the bibliography and the list of abbreviations provided on p. ix does not include MM, although that abbreviation for this work is used repeatedly. More importantly, however, the text contains scores of printing errors. In some cases these are merely distracting. In others, however, they distort or destroy the sense of the sentences.