Gadamer and Ricoeur: Critical Horizons for Contemporary Hermeneutics

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Francis J. Mootz III and George H. Taylor (eds.), Gadamer and Ricoeur: Critical Horizons for Contemporary Hermeneutics, Continuum, 2011, 297pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441175991.

Reviewed by Leslie MacAvoy, East Tennessee State University


This volume is a collection of essays on the hermeneutics of Hans-Georg Gadamer and Paul Ricoeur. Taylor and Mootz state in their introduction that the motivation for the project was to encourage further interest in both philosophers’ work. The collection aims to "demonstrate the continuing fruitfulness of Gadamer's and Ricoeur's work and to assess continuing points of similarity and difference in order to refine and extend their legacies" (1). All in all, the book accomplishes this goal. The essays are engaging and work to bring philosophical attention back to issues in hermeneutics that remain of pressing importance but which have been less prominent in the continental philosophical literature of late. They also suggest new directions for the application of insights drawn from hermeneutic philosophy.

The collection consists of twelve essays and is organized into three sections. The first and shortest section is entitled 'History' and aims to provide some historical context to the development of hermeneutic philosophy. This section contains only one essay, which seems somewhat out of balance in relation to the number of essays in the other sections, and those interested in the historical development of hermeneutics leading up to Gadamer and Ricoeur might find themselves wanting something more than is offered here. The second, largest part of the book is entitled 'Engagements' and features seven essays that elaborate upon prominent themes in the work of Gadamer and Ricoeur and put their positions into critical engagement with one another. The first four essays in this section critically examine the work of Gadamer and Ricoeur with respect to issues that emerged as significant in the Gadamer-Habermas debate, specifically the emphasis in Gadamer on universality and on belonging to a tradition and its implications for the possibility of a critical hermeneutics. Those interested in this debate and Ricoeur's position in relation to Gadamer on these issues will especially appreciate this part of the book. The third and final section of the book contains four essays and is called 'Extensions.' As the heading suggests, the organizing theme here is to develop and extend the thought of Gadamer and Ricoeur in directions that they do not explicitly pursue. The topics engaged here are quite divergent, ranging from feminism and the body to political action to the philosophy of technology to Chinese philosophy. In what follows, I will offer a few remarks on each of the essays.

The first essay, by P. Christopher Smith, is entitled "Destruktion-Konstruktion: Heidegger, Gadamer, Ricoeur" and primarily explores the historical relation of Gadamer's hermeneutics to Heidegger's, but suggests toward the end that Ricoeur's work might represent a synthesis of these two views. Although Gadamer develops his hermeneutics in Truth and Method by building upon Heidegger's conception of understanding as articulated in Being and Time, Smith chooses to heighten the contrast between Heidegger and Gadamer by focusing on Heidegger's discussion of the hermeneutics of facticity in the 1923 lecture course Ontology: The Hermeneutics of Facticity and the 1922 text "Phenomenological Interpretations of Aristotle." In this way, he argues that Heidegger's hermeneutics are primarily about destruction, i.e., clearing away false conceptions in order to open up the space for legitimate philosophizing, while Gadamer's hermeneutics primarily entails construction, i.e., forging or building understanding within a community or forging the very community itself through a fusion of horizons.

Each of the next four essays engages with issues related to the Gadamer-Habermas debate in interesting ways. Much of this debate has to do with Habermas's objection to Gadamer's position that understanding entails a fusion of horizons that involves accepting the texts of a tradition as authoritative and seeing oneself as belonging to the tradition shaped by these texts. Habermas sees this position as a conservative one that limits the possibility of a critique of the tradition, and when Ricoeur enters the debate, he finds himself in significant agreement with Habermas against Gadamer on this point.

In "The Dialectic of Belonging and Distanciation in Gadamer and Ricoeur," Merold Westphal defends Gadamer against the view that his hermeneutics is mainly concerned with belonging and has no place for distanciation, such as one finds featured in Ricoeur's work. He argues that the opposition between Gadamer's and Ricoeur's positions on understanding and interpretation is overstated. Westphal agrees with Ricoeur that interpretation requires a dialectical relationship between distanciation and belonging, but he disagrees with the judgment that the emphasis on belonging in Gadamer's view of understanding excludes distanciation, which he argues is implied in Gadamer's account of the relation that exists between reader and text. The effect of this argument is to bring Gadamer closer to Ricoeur, and thus closer to the possibility of a critical hermeneutics.

Another perspective is provided by Andreea Deciu Ritivoi in "Hermeneutics as Project of Liberation: The Concept of Tradition in Paul Ricouer and Hans-Georg Gadamer." The essay directly aims to respond to Habermas' charge that hermeneutics is basically conservative and incapable of critique. Ritivoi's response to this challenge is to grant that this may be so for Gadamer but that Ricoeur's philosophy offers more resources for thinking critically about tradition. This essay contrasts with the Westphal essay in that Ritivoi thinks it is necessary to turn to Ricoeur to correct for the emphasis on tradition, and presumably also belonging, in Gadamer, whereas Westphal believes that these resources exist within Gadamer's thought.

This concern with whether Gadamer's hermeneutics contains sufficient resources for critique is continued in Mootz's essay "Gadamer's Rhetorical Conception of Hermeneutics as the Key to Developing a Critical Hermeneutics." The author's intent is to address the same problem that the previous two essays have considered, but unlike the previous essay, which claims that to find this we have to turn to Ricoeur, this essay argues that the reason critics have not found this dimension in Gadamer is that they have either ignored or misunderstood the sense in which Gadamer's hermeneutics depends upon rhetoric. Rhetoric, it is argued, should not be understood as a mode of persuasion to be contrasted with reason, which is how Habermas understands it, but as entailing a different, broader conception of reason that is more dialogical. Mootz argues that the understanding accomplished in the fusion of horizons is a rhetorical and rational achievement (91) because it is best understood as a kind of conversation structured according to the logic of question and answer. So understood, the implication seems to be that there is a place for critical exchange within the fusion of horizons.

George Taylor's contribution, "Understanding as Metaphoric, Not a Fusion of Horizons", deals with another theme touched on in the Gadamer-Habermas debate, namely the issue of universality in Gadamer's conception of understanding. The worry is that Gadamer's notion of the fusion of horizons commits us to a universality both in the sense that some shared understanding or overlap of horizons seems to be assumed as a presupposition of dialogue and communication, and in the sense that a kind of universality is itself effected through the fusion of horizons. So, either we have to assume that differences are superficial if understanding is to occur, or we have to see understanding as entailing an elimination of difference. Both are problematic for those interested in the possibility of cross-cultural dialogue. Taylor claims that Gadamer's position is motivated by a desire to steer between two alternatives -- a Hegelian view that absolute knowledge is possible (106) and a Nietzschean pluralism where all we have are incommensurable views (109). Taylor agrees that we need to avoid these extremes, but he disagrees with Gadamer’s claim that to accomplish this we must conceive of understanding as a fusion of horizons that entails a unification of the horizons that blurs or eliminates difference. He argues instead for Ricoeur's alternative, which is that understanding is analogous to a process of translation that is metaphoric. Conceiving of understanding in these terms preserves the distance between the two positions to be translated. It takes them as equivalent, but never equates them, and always recognizes their difference.

The next three essays in the second part of the book address rather singular questions, though two of them seem to be concerned in a rather general way with the idea that Ricoeur's hermeneutics is more subject-centered than Gadamer's hermeneutics. In "Where is Muthos Hiding in Gadamer's Hermeneutics? Or, the Ontological Privilege of Emplotment," John Arthos wonders why Gadamer says nothing about narrative and comes to the conclusion that the topic is avoided because narrative is too subject-centered. Ultimately, he concludes that we have to have an account of narrative to make sense of constructive agency, and this is something Ricoeur's philosophy offers us. Gadamer's concern that emphasis on agency and subjects leads to a neglect of the other is legitimate, but Arthos argues that Gadamer's objection should be taken as a supplement to a view of agency, not as an alternative to it (136).

This skepticism regarding Gadamer's rejection of the subject is not shared by David Vessey. In his contribution, "Paul Ricoeur's and Hans-Georg Gadamer's Diverging Reflections on Recognition", he begins by asking why Gadamer apparently has nothing to say about recognition. He argues that a closer look at Gadamer reveals that he does have an account of recognition after all, and that, in the end, it is superior to Ricoeur's on the grounds that it offers a view of mutual recognition that gets us past a subject-centered focus.

The last essay in this section is "Is Phronēsis Deinon? Ricoeur on Tragedy and Phronēsis" by David H. Fisher. The essay is motivated by the question of whether phronēsis, usually understood as practical wisdom, could have the kind of disturbing function of deinon. If so, then tragedy might be able to precipitate the question of ethics, and Fisher wants to argue that this is indeed the role that tragedy plays in Ricoeur's thought.

Starting off the 'Extensions' section of the book, Bernard Dauenhauer argues in "Ricoeur's Model of Translation and Responsible Political Practice" that although Ricoeur doesn't explicitly have a conception of political action, his account of action in general may be fruitfully extended to this domain. In particular, he holds that Ricoeur's concept of translation can provide resources for thinking about democratic interaction because translation requires an emphasis on communicating with the other, making oneself understood, making sure that one understands the other, etc. He also thinks that Ricoeur's account is particularly useful for thinking about the possibility of political or moral failure because of his sensitivity to fallibility and to the possibility of failure in translation.

In their article,"Understanding the Body: The Relevance of Gadamer's and Ricoeur's View of the Body for Feminist Theory", Louise D. Derksen and Annemie Halsema consider Gadamer's and Ricoeur's respective views of the body with the aim of evaluating them from the perspective of feminist theory. Their discussion of Gadamer's remarks on the body indicates that he has an interest in the problem of the hermeneutical understanding of the body (e.g., in medical practice). Ricoeur, on the other hand, has a view of the body as a site of incarnation and, ultimately, a more phenomenological account of the body. After discussing some of the limitations of their views, as pointed out by prominent feminist critics, they gesture toward the possible potential for developing a hermeneutical approach to the body in directions that would be useful for feminist theory.

"Thing Hermeneutics" by David Kaplan is an interesting foray into the possible relevance of Gadamer and Ricoeur for philosophy of technology. Although Gadamer and Ricoeur say very little directly on the theme of technology, and when they do they tend to be rather pessimistic about it, there is nevertheless a reason to take a closer look at the resources their respective theories offer. One of the more recent developments in philosophy of technology is that of 'appropriate technology', which takes a more empirical approach to the subject by focusing on particular technologies rather than adopting a transcendental approach that treats technology as a more global or universal phenomenon. Kaplan thinks that concepts from both Gadamer and Ricoeur can be fruitfully used to analyze our interpretive engagements with things, yielding a 'thing hermeneutics'.

Finally, Kathleen Wright, in her essay entitled "Gadamer's Philosophical Hermeneutics and New Confucianism", picks up the theme of the possible conservatism of Gadamer's thought in a novel way by investigating how it is that Gadamer's hermeneutics may have come to be associated with a conservative political movement known as New Confucianism. Though she attempts, on the one hand, to argue that some of Gadamer's concepts have been distorted in order to facilitate this appropriation, she also concludes that there is something about Gadamer's thought that lends itself to being put to this use more than, for example, Ricoeur's.

All in all, the essays in this volume are interesting, though some are motivated by questions that seem somewhat idiosyncratic and so could themselves be more effectively motivated for the reader. Those who are particularly interested in the critical dynamic between Gadamer and Ricoeur will probably find the essays by Westphal, Taylor, Ritivoi, and Vessey to be the most satisfying. Other essays (Kaplan, Derkson and Halsema) offer a more comparative treatment of the two thinkers, while some essays (Dauenhauer, Write, Arthos) focus on just one of the two thinkers under consideration. A few of the essays might have been stronger if they had followed that model. In these cases, the editorial objective of addressing the work of both Gadamer and Ricoeur seems to have led authors who primarily had something to say about one of these figures to add a section on the other. In some cases this worked; in others it didn't and seemed somewhat ad hoc and gratuitous.

Despite this, the essays are generally of good quality, and some are very good indeed. All make interesting reading both for those familiar with the work of Gadamer and Ricoeur and for those who want to become better acquainted with it. In this regard, the editors have accomplished their goal of reminding readers of the value of Gadamer's and Ricoeur's philosophical work and its relevance for contemporary philosophical thinking.