Gadamer and the Question of Understanding: Between Heidegger and Derrida

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Adrian Costache, Gadamer and the Question of Understanding: Between Heidegger and Derrida, Lexington, 2016, 154pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739185018.

Reviewed by Lawrence K. Schmidt, Hendrix College


"Actually both [Derrida and Nietzsche] speak and write in order to be understood."

                                                 (Gadamer in Dialogue and Deconstruction, 57)

Adrian Costache explicitly tells the reader he intends to resolve a paradox found in the scholarship concerning Hans-Georg Gadamer. On the one hand, as is discussed in part I, Gadamer is understood as the "urbanizer" (Habermas) and disciple of Heidegger. Philosophical hermeneutics is, in Gadamer's own words, a "'translation'" of Heidegger's philosophy into the realm of understanding in the humanities. On the other hand, Gadamer is understood as the "founding father" of philosophical hermeneutics, the culmination of hermeneutics, as well as being its pre-eminent philosopher. This is the subject matter of part II, where Costache discusses Gadamer's "silent turn against Heidegger" that begins with Gadamer's discussion of Aristotle in Truth and Method. Perhaps most important is the third part where Costache examines the three questions Derrida addressed to Gadamer in their famous encounter in Paris in 1981. He argues that the Gadamer-Derrida encounter was not, as most have understood it, "nothing more than a misunderstanding" (95). Rather, the three questions that Derrida posed are critical questions that "go straight to the heart of the matter and manage to point out a series of shortcomings and limitations of Gadamer's hermeneutic reflection" (96). These limitations support his final conclusion: since Derrida is not to be included in the hermeneutic tradition, "what has been showed here is an indication that with Gadamer, the hermeneutic tradition has been exhausted and that it can be considered ended" (147). Unfortunately, the reader will have to exercise hermeneutic sensibilities with the many typographical errors still in the text.

Costache demonstrates that Gadamer is a mere disciple of Heidegger by initially analyzing the chapter on Dilthey in Truth and Method. After criticizing other interpretations, he argues that Gadamer's "correction of Dilthey reflects faithfully Heidegger's own correction just as his critique develops Heidegger's reproach" (28). Gadamer continues to develop Heidegger's analysis of understanding when he begins to discuss the elements of hermeneutic experience. Heidegger's fore-structures of understanding are incorporated by Gadamer into the effect of tradition. The authority of tradition is developed from Heidegger's sense of "preservation" in The Origin of the Work of Art. Gadamer does modify Heidegger's discussion of understanding by developing a "historical hermeneutics of facticity" and corrects Heidegger by including the fore-conception of completion (43). The movement in the hermeneutic circle is between the interpreter's horizon and the historical text and is only a modification of Heidegger's analysis. For Gadamer understanding is then the fusion of horizons that is again similar to Heidegger in that it "gives the 'form' of our historical life" (45). What is surprising and questionable is that Costache finds that the discussion of the fusion of horizons completes Gadamer's hermeneutic analysis. He writes, "precisely at the point where Gadamer should have put the final full stop to Truth and Method, quite unexpectedly he pushes his work one step further and reformulates the concept of 'fusion of horizons' as 'application'" (54-55). However, Costache does not understand that the central question concerning the adjudication of prejudices that permits the fusion of horizons has not yet been answered in Truth and Method. It is for this reason that Gadamer turns to Aristotle in order to answer the central problem of hermeneutics.

For Costache the paradox is resolved. Had Gadamer completed Truth and Method with the analysis of the principle of effective history and the fusion of horizons, he would have remained a mere disciple of Heidegger. However, with the analysis of application, effective historical consciousness, and the ontological turn towards language where understanding occurs in the conversation of an I and a Thou, Gadamer "can be regarded as a more important hermeneutic thinker than his teacher" (89). This is the subject matter of part II. The analysis of phronesis in Aristotle allows Gadamer to argue that hermeneutic understanding is not a derivative historical one but an existential-ontological disposition of Dasein. That understanding is a dialogue between an I and a Thou elevates the importance of the other that "occupies a marginal role in Heidegger's work" (62). The other first raises the question to which the interpreter then seeks an answer in the text. Tradition itself is a Thou that questions the interpreter and that allows the historical other to speak. The effect of tradition permits effective historical consciousness to begin inquiry and this applies to the later Heidegger as well. The world is disclosed by language as with Heidegger, but Gadamer insists that speaking also grounds language: "Language has its being in dialogue because it is formed and becomes what it is through this dialectic" (83). For Costache these developments demonstrate Gadamer's status as the pre-eminent hermeneutic thinker.

The most important, if not the most contentious, part of the book is the third, where Costache examines the three questions Derrida addressed to Gadamer in their famous encounter in Paris in 1981. The first question concerns the presupposition of a Kantian good will and the charge of returning thereby to a metaphysics of the will. Derrida is pointing to "Gadamer's commitment for consensus in understanding" that plays an axiomatic role in philosophical hermeneutics (98). According to Costache, however, one engages in interpretation not "because of what this understanding would enable us to do," as Gadamer thought, but rather as the "belief and hope" that the other may have something to say, even if this may be groundless (99). The commitment to consensus in this sense is one shared by Derrida and Gadamer. "It is a question Derrida wanted to ask along with Gadamer" (100).

The second question concerns the inclusion of psychoanalytic hermeneutics in Gadamer's claim for hermeneutic universality. Derrida charges that this inclusion would require an overall re-structuring of the concept of the hermeneutic context. Costache argues that psychoanalysis is really a representation for any case of double or hidden meanings, which he finds extensive in the hermeneutic tradition. Gadamer should have explained how, under the commitment to consensus, understanding hidden meanings could occur. The mere expansion of the hermeneutic context, as Gadamer proposed in answering Derrida, would not suffice, but rather a discontinuous restructuring of the context would be required. This was the point of Derrida's question and it exposes a "limitation and a failure of Gadamer's philosophical hermeneutics" (102).

Derrida's third question claims that the precondition for understanding the other is not a continuity of sympathetic agreement, a rapport as in a commitment to consensus and saying what one means, but rather a "'certain rapport of interruption' leading to the 'suspending of all mediation'" (103). It should be noted, however, that Derrida understands the experience of coming to be in agreement as one in which "one has been perfectly understood" (Dialogue and Deconstruction, 54 emphasis added). It is clear that Gadamer, recognizing the finitude of human being, argues only for a partial understanding of the other in coming to be in agreement. Derrida and, following him, Costache, understand mediation to mean the complete overcoming of the otherness of the other. Costache claims that to suspend mediation cuts at the heart of philosophical hermeneutics since understanding is claimed to be a coming to be in agreement. Costache turns to Derrida's "Rams" to explicate Derrida's critique of Gadamer. There, Derrida demonstrates that Gadamer's interpretation of Celan indirectly recognizes interruption as part of the hermeneutic object, includes an external interruption, and shows that interruption as a precondition for understanding is "one of the basic presuppositions of Gadamer's thought" (104). Costache concludes that Derrida has proven that either "philosophical hermeneutics [is] incapable to account for the alterity of the other" or, if this were remedied, it would not be a correction to Gadamer, but a "radically different" view of understanding (107).

In the final chapter Costache examines and answers two of the questions Derrida posed to Gadamer. He begins by considering Gadamer's critique of Derrida in his "Hermeneutics Tracking the Trace," which he considers to be written in "the relaxed style characteristic of his old age, moving swiftly from one issue to another" (111). He argues that Gadamer "oversimplifies his [Derrida's] position, sometimes to the point of making it unrecognizable" (112). Through a brief examination of Saussure, he claims that "Gadamer does not really understand" what is meant by "sign" (113). He first considers how Derrida's concept of the arche-trace or differance proves that understanding presupposes a rapport of interruption. For Gadamer understanding first requires the "foregrounding" of the interpreter's horizon "from the strange horizon of the hermeneutic object" (121). However, "In order to understand an other, one has to acknowledge its alterity" and so cannot assimilate the other in the fusion of horizons (121). Costache concludes that Gadamer "knew it [the presupposition of a rapport of interruption] without knowing it" (122).

With the second question, "Derrida wanted to warn Gadamer" that if he attempted to incorporate double meanings into his hermeneutics (the case of psychoanalysis), he would have to "drop any reference to the notion of hermeneutic situation" (123). Derrida demonstrates this in his analysis of spacing, not only the white space between the words of a text, but also the difference between what the author wants to say and what the text says. "spacing makes it impossible to determine the linguistic or semantic context of a piece of writing," since the writing is infinitely repeatable (126). Further, since Gadamer acknowledges that when we understand we understand differently, we cannot say which, if any, of us actually understood the text. This, according to Costache, eliminates the idea of a hermeneutic situation. The "interpreter loses any certainty as to whether she has ever actually understood at all" (127 emphasis added). Gadamer, however, does not argue for certainty in understanding, but for a partial understanding within differing hermeneutic situations.

The same argument can be applied to the Sache or subject matter that is to be understood in interpretation. Gadamer accepts that meanings change and this means, according to Costache, that it is just "a play of difference" (130). Gadamer also argues that we are led by the conversation more than we conduct the conversation. This, however, means "that a conversation is nothing more than a long series of digressions" (131). Gadamer does not recognize these as problematic and maintains that at the end of the conversation the subject matter will "shine forth" (131). Quoting Derrida's conclusion in Dissemination, Costache argues by analogy that this applies to the subject matter as well: "'a theme [and so the subject matter] does not exist. . . . Or if it does exist, it will always have been unreadable'" (131). Therefore, "the idea of matter at hand itself is nothing more than a theoretical illusion" (133).

Neither can the interpreter claim to understand nor is there anything to be understood. This being the case, the hermeneutic concept of a text as something that has something to say to us is incorrect. Costache claims that a text does not point to some subject matter outside itself. In support he quotes a passage of Derrida that he claims "holds the key to that oft repeated claim Derrida makes in Of Grammatology that . . . 'There is nothing outside of the text'" (136, emphasis added). The proper sense of a text is "'a fabric of traces'" with no original meaning nor any subject matter that it expresses. One wonders why Costache writes.

Concluding this part concerning Derrida's critique of Gadamer following the Paris encounter, Costache argues that to understand it to invent and "To invert [sic] the other is not to create it" (137). Rather, following Derrida in "Rams," interpretation as reading is really "'reading-writing,'" the invention of meaning if not its creation. It is not creation because interpretation is not completely arbitrary since there are "those very principles that make the text mean anything in the first place" (140). So a text does have a meaning. Nevertheless, Costache claims that interpretation is invention because whatever determinate interpretation is offered, the interpreter cannot claim to have understood the text nor is there a subject matter to be understood.

In his "Final Conclusion" Costache tells the reader what he has intended. "In the third and last part of the book, we saw that nearly all the steps forward taken by Gadamer . . . are problematic in themselves" (146). They are problematic from a Derridian perspective and so must be themselves corrected. He lists seven. Since Derrida is not to be included in the hermeneutic tradition, "what has been showed here is an indication that with Gadamer, the hermeneutic tradition has been exhausted and that it can be considered ended" (147).

What is frustrating about this book and especially the third part is that Costache appears to contradict himself. He argues that the interpreter cannot know if the text has been understood, but, and perhaps for that reason, continually tells the reader what is intended. He has argued that the subject matter is merely a theoretical illusion, and yet tells the reader he welcomes criticism since this means that someone has given "thought to the matters discussed" (9). In finding the "key" to interpreting Derrida's statement, he implies there is one meaning to be discovered. In his defense, he does note that "it matters little whether our interpretation is methodologically correct from a Derridean perspective. What matters is for it to be so for a Gadamerian one" (140). This reviewer doubts whether Costache has provided an acceptable Gadamerian interpretation.


Michelfelder, Diane and Palmer, Richard (eds.), Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter, State University of New York Press, 1989.