Gadamer and the Transmission of History

Placeholder book cover

Jerome Veith, Gadamer and the Transmission of History, Indiana University Press, 2015, 219pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253015983.

Reviewed by Greg Lynch, North Central College


Jerome Veith's book is a clearly written and remarkably well-researched analysis of the concept of 'historical effect' [Wirkungsgeschichte] that lies at the heart of Gadamer's hermeneutics. 'Historical effect,' in a nutshell, refers to the formative influence that history, through culture and language, exerts on an agent's thoughts and actions. Gadamer claims that all human understanding is historically effected and that we can never make these effects completely transparent to ourselves. This is his well-known doctrine that all understanding involves 'prejudices'. Gadamer's views on historical effect are probably the most frequently discussed components of his thought -- so much so that one might wonder why a book-length treatment of this topic is necessary. Veith, however, manages to make an original and important contribution to the existing literature by approaching the material from a unique angle.

Specifically, Veith is interested in the ethical conclusions that Gadamer draws from his claims about human historicity. Veith advances two related theses on this front. First, he argues that the fact that human beings are historical creatures is what grounds Gadamer's identification of 'openness' (the attitude of Socratic humility before others, in which one is eager to learn from them and willing to expose one's own views to criticism) as a fundamental ethical virtue. To be historically effected is to be essentially limited in one's perspective, and an attitude of openness to the perspectives of others is the only "adequate response" to a recognition of these limits (113, cf. 7). Second, Veith argues that the ultimate value of the humanities lies in their ability to cultivate this openness. He laments that "Currently, this idea of Bildung[cultivation] has all but disappeared from the popular discourse concerning the humanities" (148). Instead, the only justifications of the humanities currently on offer locate their value only in the ability to foster "instrumental social virtues" (159) such as the capacity for "data-driven decision making" (148). Veith grants that these sorts of defenses have their place, but he contends that they overlook the inherent value of the "conscious engagement" with "our existence as historical-linguistic beings" that studying the humanities is uniquely capable of providing (159).

The bulk of Veith's book does not discuss these theses directly but rather sets the stage for them by carefully articulating Gadamer's account of historical effect. Veith carries this out via three "comparative analyses" (9) of Gadamer with figures who influenced his thinking about historicity: Heidegger, Hegel, and Kant. These analyses comprise, respectively, chapters two through four of the book.

At a number of points Veith frames this comparative approach as providing an argument for a 'performative' dimension in Gadamer's work. "Gadamer," he writes, "not only formulates conceptually what it means to understand historically, but places this formulation in concrete contexts, and thereby also enacts the very consciousness of historical effect that he describes" (8, cf. 43). This trope is, I think, a little overblown. It's true that Gadamer, by and large, practices what he preaches. He emphasizes the importance of developing our ideas through dialogue with historical texts, and he in fact does this in the development of his own ideas. But surely there is nothing uniquely Gadamerian about the idea that, in writing a philosophical treatise on X, one should interact with what other philosophers have said about X. (Almost) everybody does that, and there is nothing especially unique about the way that Gadamer does it -- or, at least, if there is, Veith does not identify it.

That being said, I found the three comparative chapters to contain the most valuable and most original insights in the book. The main question that organizes these chapters concerns the degree of freedom or autonomy that Gadamer's account of historical effect allows for. This is a natural question to raise since it would seem that the more our thoughts and actions are shaped by historical factors outside our control (especially factors whose influence largely escapes our notice), the less they are unqualifiedly attributable to us. This is a bit of a thorny issue for Gadamer but one that has received surprisingly little attention in the secondary literature.

As Veith's account of Heidegger's influence on Gadamer makes clear, the latter denies that the Enlightenment ideal of complete autonomy is possible, or even desirable, for human beings. It is an essential feature of human existence that we are 'thrown' into a historical situation, and we cannot escape this by making history's influences on us completely transparent in reflection. For both Gadamer and Heidegger,

The immediate horizon of the historical present includes everything that one takes to be familiar, and is largely made up of one's own prejudices and intentions, but it is not derived from one's agency alone. Because of this, it often includes things with which one is not entirely familiar, or which one in any case did not actively decide to bring into the situation. That is the fact of alterity or strangeness within the horizon, and one that cannot ever be eradicated. (140)

The fact of historical effect, then, means that human beings are always to at least some degree heteronomous.

Ideas like this have led many of Gadamer's critics (and even some of his admirers) to interpret him as claiming that we are locked in to a particular, historically provincial, way of understanding the world. Veith notes that, properly understood, neither Heidegger nor Gadamer endorse this form of 'perspectivism'. Both affirm that our horizons are capable of 'moving' over time even in dramatically counter-cultural directions. Gadamer's account of this movement, however, owes more to the influence of Hegel than Heidegger.

The key insight that Gadamer gleans from Hegel is that the movement of our thinking is driven forward by 'experience.' 'Experience' is for Hegel (and for Gadamer) a technical term. It refers specifically to episodes in which (a) we discover that something is otherwise than we previously understood it to be, and (b) this 'negation' leads us to a new, more comprehensive understanding of the thing. Experiences are in this way capable of breaking us free from our prejudices (though never from all at once) and opening us to new and more inclusive perspectives on the world. The possibility of transformative experience shows that our individual horizons are not fixed boundaries; they are movable, "provisional" regions of "one great horizon" that encompasses everything that can be understood (140).

While Hegel's idea of experience provides Gadamer with an account of the movement of understanding, it is not yet enough to provide an account of its freedom or autonomy. If the "reversal[s] of consciousness" (88) that characterize experience are simply foisted on us from without, then they are no more a locus of autonomy than are our prejudices. Gadamer thus needs to be able to say that we exercise some sort of agency in the transformative process of experience. Veith addresses this concern by arguing that Gadamer is "more indebted to enlightenment ideas than is commonly believed," that "There is … a parallel to be traced between Kant's announcement of the social project of sapere aude and Gadamer's account of the task of engaging dialogically with historical effect" (119).

Gadamer's debt to Kant's idea of enlightenment shows up most clearly in his contention that engagement with tradition "does not involve a relinquishment of critical capacities in the face of authority" (166). These critical capacities are directed towards both ourselves and others. In the first case, they involve a "reflection that emancipates us from an inimical, unconscious embeddedness in tradition" (141). Gadamer argues that such a reflection is an essential component of negative experience. Experience 'foregrounds' one or more of our prejudices (typically, the ones responsible for the initial misunderstanding of the thing) and makes them available for explicit rational consideration.[1] What was once operative implicitly in the background of our thinking is now brought to the foreground, and we can reflect on whether this is really something we have reason to accept or not. The same is true in the second case, where the claim in question is not one of our own prejudices, but the claim of a historical text or artwork. Veith explains,

Depending on whether we are convinced by the past's claims, we might just as well take them over as reject them, and therein lies the freedom of our responsiveness to tradition. Nevertheless, this freedom can be exercised well or poorly, and there is something of an evaluative standard by which to assess its use. At issue is whether one attends adequately enough to tradition's claims, whether one not only listens to the past, but listens with an ear toward reasons and the questionability of one's own claims. Briefly put, it is a matter of negative experience and openness. (142)

The hermeneutical engagement with tradition that occurs in dialogue, then, is not governed entirely by the impersonal forces of history. It involves a self-responsible exercise of "reflective social reason" (10).

Thus while Gadamer denies that we could ever foreground all of our prejudices so as to achieve the kind of complete self-transparency that Kant and Hegel envision, he nevertheless affirms we are capable of at least some significant form of autonomy. What makes his account unique is that, in his view, we achieve what degree of autonomy we can not by retreating from the influences of history and society but rather precisely by opening ourselves up to them, allowing them to challenge our assumptions and make claims on us.

The main difficulty I found in Veith's book concerns his interaction with John Caputo's critique of Gadamer. Caputo argues that, despite his insistence on historical finitude, Gadamer still agrees with Hegel's basic 'infinitism.' What Caputo means by this is that Gadamer, like Hegel, still believes that there is such a thing as "eternal" and "unified" truth. Gadamer's modification of Hegel is simply to claim that, since human agents are finite, there can be no complete and definitive expression of this truth. On this reading, then, for Gadamer to say that dialogue is 'infinite' is simply to say that the human task of trying to discover and articulate the truth can never be completed. In this sense Gadamer embraces Hegel's 'bad infinity.' Caputo argues that this view fails to account for the possibility of a radical form of alterity. Gadamer allows for the possibility of others grasping aspects of the truth that we do not, but he insists that this truth is always, at least in principle, capable of being 'fused' with (or, in Caputo's more extreme language, "consumed" by) those aspects of the truth that we are already familiar with. Gadamer fails to countenance the possibility that truth itself is 'disunified' or 'ruptured' and thus that experience might confront us with a truth that cannot, even in principle, be made to jibe with what we already know.[2]

In my view, Caputo's interpretation of Gadamer is accurate, but the problem he identifies is illusory. I don't see any reason why Gadamer needs to countenance the possibility of radical alterity or of 'ruptured' truth because I don't see any reason to think that such things are possible in the first place. Veith, however, apparently finds Caputo's worry legitimate. He notes that if Caputo's reading is right, it would be "fatal" to Gadamer's "hermeneutics of alterity" because it would "commit Gadamer to a dialectics of consumption, in which the other cannot remain other but is always eventually appropriated to oneself"[3] (85). Veith thus responds to Caputo not by denying the legitimacy of his demand for radical alterity but by showing that Gadamer does, in fact, leave room for this.

This is Veith's strategy, but I don't think it succeeds. He attempts to defend Gadamer by showing that the 'bad infinity' he embraces is not identical to the one Hegel describes (85-6). What sets Gadamer apart is that he acknowledges not only an "outer infinity" but an "inner" one as well (99). In Gadamer's view, it is not only the case that the task of understanding the external world is an infinite one that cannot be completed but also that the task of understanding ourselves is infinite, too. This is certainly what Gadamer thinks, but I fail to see why it would satisfy Caputo. Insofar as Gadamer affirms an inner infinity, it will be subject to the same 'critique' that Caputo levies against the 'outer' one. Claiming that the self cannot be completely known is not enough to meet Caputo's demands. He's after the more radical idea that there is no unified self to be known in the first place. ("There is no you -- that is you!")[4] This, I think, is a more radical claim than Gadamer is willing to make.

It might be a good thing that Veith fails to appease Caputo because it seems that if he did, it would significantly undercut his wider project in the book. What Caputo finds distastefully 'conservative' about Gadamer is precisely the idea of "one great horizon" to which Veith (rightly, in my view) appeals at a number of crucial points. It is Gadamer's affirmation of this horizon (i.e., of the idea that all truth is unified, and thus understandable, in principle, by anyone) that allows him to affirm that negative experiences are not merely negative but 'productive' as well. Further, it would seem that affirmation of this one great horizon is a necessary presupposition of the 'critical' moment that Veith (again, correctly) finds at work in Gadamer. For, if truth is fundamentally disunified, if there can be no guarantee that the truth of what the other says is 'fusable,' at least in principle, with the truth in my own thinking, then it is hard to see how any sort of critical social reason could be legitimately brought to bear on it. Caputo, I suspect, would see the exercise of this sort of rational evaluation as a kind of 'violence', as an attempt to 'reduce the other to the same.'

This difficulty, however, concerns only a secondary point of Veith's analysis. I find it hard to disagree with his main contentions. The view he attributes to Gadamer is both philosophically plausible and exceptionally well-supported by references to a broad swath of Gadamer's corpus. The book should prove to be a valuable resource not only to philosophers interested in Gadamer's account of history but those of Kant, Hegel, and Heidegger as well.

[1] Hans-Georg Gadamer, Truth and Method, trans. Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall, 2nd ed. (New York: Continuum, 1989), 299.

[2] John D. Caputo, Radical Hermeneutics (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1987), 108-115.

[3] I think Veith's point would be better expressed by replacing 'eventually' with 'capable of being.' Since, even according to Caputo's reading, Gadamer does not think that the 'appropriation' can ever be completed.

[4] John D. Caputo, More Radical Hermeneutics (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2000), 55.