Agamben and Politics: A Critical Introduction

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Sergei Prozorov, Agamben and Politics: A Critical Introduction, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 200pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748676217.

Reviewed by Adam Kotsko, Shimer College


The field of secondary works on Agamben is becoming crowded, particularly works on his political thought. This year alone, Sergei Prozorov's Agamben and Politics joins Mathew Abbott's The Figure of This World: Agamben and the Question of Political Ontology (Edinburgh) and Jessica Whyte's Catastrophe and Redemption: The Political Thought of Giorgio Agamben. This multiplication should not be taken as simple repetition, however. In these and other recent studies, it could be said that the scholarship on Agamben's political thought is moving into a second phase, one that emphasizes the need to understand Agamben's project as a whole before grappling with his specifically political works.

By contrast, the first phase of scholarship centered narrowly on his books Homo Sacer and State of Exception, whose investigation of the sovereign exception and its production of bare life appeared both urgent and timely in the early years of the War on Terror. Indeed, Agamben made that topical connection himself in State of Exception, which includes a long footnote placing measures like the Patriot Act and the detention of "enemy combatants" at Guantanamo in a broader historical context of increasing reliance on emergency measures among Western powers throughout the 20th century.

For scholars working in this vein, Agamben's work provided useful concepts for thinking through -- and often also for denouncing -- the policies of the Bush administration. Yet from this point of view, there is much in his writing that appears strange and disproportionate. First of all, Agamben does not seem to be calling, as common sense would dictate, for a return to the "normal" rule of law, but rather to be gesturing toward a more thorough-going alternative to the structure of Western politics. Second, and correlatively, Agamben's target is not the Bush administration or any other supposedly aberrant phenomenon, but the Western political tradition as such -- a tradition that Agamben characterizes as having always been headed toward the horrors of the concentration camp.

Like other authors in what I'm calling the second phase of scholarship, Prozorov is explicitly reacting to this body of work, which he claims "emphasizes his critique of the Western political tradition at the expense of his affirmation of a radically new politics, which tends to be dismissed as utopian, naïve, and incoherent or simply ignored," and leads to the conclusion that "Agamben is . . . a strident if not outright shrill critic of the occidental tradition of politics" (2-3). In contrast to this approach, whose one-sided reading of Agamben renders his positions ultimately incomprehensible, Prozorov proposes that we must situate Agamben's political thought within the context of his broader philosophical project.

Before we can understand that project, however, Prozorov claims that we must grasp "the fundamental attunement or mood of Agamben's philosophy," which he claims is a fundamentally "comic" one (3). Prozorov admits that this characterization is somewhat counter-intuitive for an author who focuses on overwhelmingly morbid topics such as totalitarianism and the Shoah (and who, I might add, often seems to share with his mentor Heidegger an ontological incapacity to make jokes). Yet Prozorov specifies that he intends the "comic" to be understood not as indicating the presence of humor or light-heartedness, but strictly in contrast to the "tragic." Put simply, where the tragic traces an inexorable path from a fortunate beginning to a devastating end, the comic moves from unfavorable circumstances to a happy ending.

Agamben's account of the structures of Western politics is surely unfavorable, but what gives his philosophy a comic shape, for Prozorov, is his emphasis on "the contingency of the apparatuses that govern our existence and hence the possibility of their overcoming" (10). To this basic optimism is added what Prozorov will later call "the 'Hölderlin principle' of the simultaneous growth of danger and saving power" (64), so that as Western power structures become more nihilistic and destructive, the prospect of overcoming them becomes all the more promising. Unlike in the tragic paradigm, however, this overcoming cannot take the form of an inexorable unfolding of the internal logic of those power structures, but must rather be thought in terms of bringing them to a stop, to a thoroughly contingent and unexpected end.

Having established this "fundamental attunement," Prozorov moves on to his second and, in my view, most valuable chapter, which explores the key Agambenian concept of inoperativity. Early in the chapter, he briefly sketches the concept as follows:

For Agamben, the way to bring things to the end consists not in the teleological fulfillment of a process of development (the end as completion or accomplishment) nor in the merely negative act of the destruction or elimination of an object (the end as termination or cessation). Instead, it is the process of becoming or rendering something inoperative, deactivating its functioning in the apparatus and making it available for free use. Happy life is thus made possible by neutralizing the multiple apparatuses of power to which we are subjected, including our own identities formed within them. (31)

Having laid out the basic structure of this elusive concept, Prozorov then proceeds to make his way through examples taken from all period's of Agamben's work and to clarify the methodological stakes of Agamben's commitment to inoperativity. Particularly useful here is his discussion of the relationship between inoperativity and glory. At times, the two concepts can seem to be identical, but Prozorov clarifies that glory is a kind of sidelining of inoperativity into a separate realm where it cannot do its subversive work of rendering power structures unworkable.

The third chapter focuses on Agamben's early writings on language and ontology, most notably the crucial Language and Death. Prozorov had early on pointed out that "the main thesis of Homo Sacer is already contained in the conclusion to the 1982 book Language and Death" (5), and in the present chapter he claims that Homo Sacer "can hardly be understood in isolation" from the earlier work. What the writings of this period elaborate is the notion of a "negative foundation," a gesture in which every system (most notably language) founds itself by projecting some prior foundation that can only be conceived in terms of deprivation or lack (in this case, a pure animal voice devoid of linguistic meaning, which Agamben calls "Voice").

While the negative foundation seems to preexist the system, it is actually produced by it -- not just once and for all, but continually. This negative foundation both legitimates the system and leads its subjects on the wild goose chase of "returning" to a false origin that the system itself produces. In order to get out of this vicious circle, Agamben recommends that we step back from the nostalgic quest for origins and instead meditate on the sheer fact that there is language, a gesture that makes room for a new and more liberated stance toward language and hence toward our very humanity. In this way, humanity can reclaim its pure potentiality beyond its actual entrapment in the concrete apparatuses that order our lives.

With this basic structure in hand, Prozorov proceeds in the fourth chapter to examine the more properly political works of the Homo Sacer series, which he claims "only become fully intelligible on the basis of Agamben's critique of the logic of negative foundation and his program for the reappropriation of human potentiality." Agamben's signature concept of bare life, Prozorov explains, is "the exact correlate of the notion of the Voice in the philosophy of language" (93). Like Voice, "bare life does not precede politics but is rather its product . . . Rather than being natural, bare life is in a sense always denatured as a result of its inclusion into the political order" (95). Instead of attempting to overthrow the sovereign structure that produces bare life, therefore, we must reappropriate our potentiality in the sense of reappropriating "the sovereignty that characterizes our very being" (119).

The fourth chapter is the most properly political, and it also has the virtue of engaging closely with two of Agamben's most prominent critics: Derrida and Negri. The fifth chapter, by contrast, reconstructs Agamben's tacit intervention into the debate over the "end of history" inaugurated by Francis Fukuyama. Tracing Agamben's debt to Alexandre Kojève, one of Fukuyama's primary sources, Prozorov contrasts the teleological concept of "the end of history" with Agamben's more properly messianic politics of inoperativity. In Prozorov's reading, Agamben's messianic state would turn crucially on a reconfiguration of humanity's relationship to its animal nature, and thus the fifth chapter lays the groundwork for the sixth and final chapter on Agamben's brief and enigmatic work on humanity and animality, The Open. In what amounts to a detailed summary of the book and its primary sources, this chapter presents the "anthropological machine," which according to Agamben continually produces the difference between human and animal, as "strictly identical to that of the sovereign state of exception" (156) and hence identical to the structure of the negative foundation.

One of the primary virtues of Prozorov's book is its emphasis on Agamben's consistency and continuity. This is particularly true given that, in an introductory text, it is crucial to give the reader basic patterns to search out and recognize, a task that is especially urgent in the case of Agamben's sprawling body of work. Nevertheless, it seems to me that Prozorov overemphasizes the recurring patterns to the detriment of any account of Agamben's development. Indeed, there is a real danger of oversimplifying Agamben's approach so that it appears to be a mechanical application of the same schema over and over in radically heterogeneous areas of study. Relatedly, though I have highlighted how helpful and important Prozorov's analysis of inoperativity is, his focus on Agamben's "alternative" to existing structures may be disproportionate in light of the fragmentary and gestural nature of the relevant texts. (The chapter on "the end of history" seems particularly under-motivated in this regard.) Meanwhile, the text does not give adequate attention to portions of Agamben's oeuvre that are much more recognizably political -- including his analysis of economy in The Kingdom and the Glory and his study of the political and ethical legacy of liturgy in Opus Dei. Aside from its topical interest, close attention to The Kingdom and the Glory would be particularly beneficial insofar as it would not be so easy to fit Agamben's analysis into the schema that Prozorov finds continually repeating itself elsewhere.

The downsides of Prozorov's emphasis on Agamben's consistency and his "alternative" emerge most clearly in the chapter on The Open. Now it is certainly the case that a close study of one particular text is very helpful in the context of an introductory work, as a way of modeling the author's approach to reading Agamben. Nevertheless, the choice of The Open is counter-intuitive in a book ostensibly about politics, particularly given that much of the chapter is taken up with a summary of texts by Heidegger, which Agamben summarizes with reasonable clarity in the book itself. Why not a guide to Homo Sacer? Indeed, why not a guide that emphasizes the fact -- more or less ignored by Prozorov -- that the ontological and linguistic concepts from the earlier works are not merely echoed or repeated, but are directly included and elaborated throughout the text of Homo Sacer?

Instead of exhorting Agamben's critics to do their homework -- salutary as that would be -- such a reading of Homo Sacer would demonstrate that the keys to understanding Agamben on his own terms were hiding in plain sight, in a book that is, after all, presented as an introduction to and distillation of his project. Perhaps that will be the task of a third phase of Agamben scholarship. In the meantime, Prozorov has provided us with a wide-ranging study of Agamben's work that is both useful and engaging, a study that will surely meet its goal of enticing and emboldening its readers to return to Agamben's own texts with renewed interest and understanding.