Genealogy as Critique: Foucault and the Problems of Modernity

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Colin Koopman, Genealogy as Critique: Foucault and the Problems of Modernity, Indiana University Press, 2013, 348pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253006219.

Reviewed by Amy Allen, Dartmouth College


The overall aim of Colin Koopman's Genealogy as Critique is "to explicate genealogy in such a way as to show that it offers a valuable, effective, and uniquely important practice of philosophical-historical critique of the present" (5). Michel Foucault's genealogical method, which serves as Koopman's paradigm case of genealogy, is enormously influential but often misunderstood by critics and fans alike. Koopman's defense of genealogy rests on a two-step revision of our understanding of Foucault's method: first, Koopman rethinks the relationship between Foucaultian genealogy and Kantian critique; second, he interprets Foucault's practice of Kantian critique through the lens of problematization. Once we reinterpret Foucaultian genealogy along these lines, Koopman argues, we will be able to see that his work belongs in conversation with that of critical theorists such as Habermas and pragmatists such as Dewey and Rorty, rather than with the Continental high theorists -- Derrida, Lacan, and Agamben -- with whom he is more often associated. In the end, Koopman proposes an ambitious methodological reconciliation of Foucaultian genealogy with pragmatist critical theory in which the former fulfills the backward looking, diagnostic task of articulating our most pressing problems and the latter fulfills the forward looking, anticipatory task of suggesting possible responses to those problems.

The book divides into roughly three, not entirely equal, parts. After an introductory chapter that situates Koopman's view within existing Foucault scholarship, the first four chapters explicate the method of genealogical problematization, understood as a transformative renewal of the Kantian notion of critique. The next two chapters re-read Foucault's work in light of the account of his method offered in the first half of the book. The concluding chapter makes the case for the methodological reconciliation of Foucaultian genealogy as problematization and pragmatist critical theory. The book as a whole is guided by Koopman's understanding of philosophy as a critical enterprise, "an immanent and reflexive engagement with the full complexity and contingency of the conditions of possibility for doing, being, and thinking in our cultural present" (23).

Chapter one introduces the concept of problematization and argues that it is the key to understanding Foucault's method and thus his oeuvre. Although the term "problematization" only appears with regularity and in Koopman's precise sense in Foucault's late work, Koopman argues quite compellingly that "the concept of problematization provides us with a better grip on the full range of Foucault's methodology than do episteme, discursive formation, dispositif, and other such concepts," all of which are best understood as "successive attempts to work out the kind of idea that achieves self-clarity with the concept of problematization" (53). In the course of developing this argument, Koopman offers a novel account of the relationship between archaeology and genealogy whereby the latter is understood as an expansion of rather than a replacement for the former. Whereas archaeology focused on temporal discontinuity, genealogy expanded this focus and embraced both continuity and discontinuity in history; whereas archaeology focused on knowledge, genealogy expanded this focus to power-knowledge relations. As Koopman puts it, archaeology-plus-genealogy traverses multiple vectors (power-knowledge rather than just power) along multiple temporalities (continuous and discontinuous). With respect to the master concept of problematization, archaeology articulates existing problematizations in their static forms, whereas genealogy traces their contingent emergence in and through complex practices (47).

With the focus now squarely on genealogy, chapter two zeroes in on the genealogical method. Koopman's main aim here is to distinguish Foucault's problematizing genealogical method from the subversive and vindicatory versions of genealogy offered by Nietzsche and Bernard Williams, respectively; he also argues that this characterization of Foucaultian genealogy shows why the genetic fallacy objection, often raised against Foucault, misses the mark. What distinguishes Foucault's problematizing genealogy from Nietzsche's and Williams's more normatively ambitious versions is that whereas they used genealogy to generate normative justifications -- Williams used it to vindicate our concept of truthfulness whereas Nietzsche used it to undermine Christian morality -- Foucault used it for the normatively modest task of clarifying and intensifying our problematizations. If, Koopman argues, Foucault wasn't trying to draw any normative conclusions from his genealogical arguments, then he can hardly be guilty of inappropriately drawing normative conclusions about some present concept or practice on the basis of an analysis of its history, as the genetic fallacy charge alleges. Foucault's genealogies do provide resources for normative critique, on Koopman's view, but his genealogies by themselves are not meant to be tools of normative assessment. Koopman thinks this also shows why Foucault's version of genealogy is superior to Nietzsche's and Williams's, since both Nietzsche and Williams try to get more from genealogy than it can possibly give.

Chapter three explicates the core ideas of genealogy as problematization: contingency, complexity, and critique. This chapter and the next one -- titled "What Problematization Is" and "What Problematization Does" -- are really the core of the book. Here, Koopman helpfully pins down the up till now rather slippery term "problematization," noting that it has two dimensions and that each of these dimensions has two senses. A problematization is both "an act of critical inquiry . . . and a nominal object of inquiry," hence the term has both a verbal (to problematize) and a nominal (a problematization) form (98). Foucaultian genealogy engages both dimensions of the term simultaneously: it problematizes things (that is, renders some things problematic that were not previously considered as such) and it articulates problematizations (that is, things that have become problematic and the process by which they have become so). Further, each of these dimensions of problematization has two senses: to problematize is both to describe and to critique existing problematizations, and a problematization has both negative and positive aspects (100). Problematizations are both contingent and complex; hence, genealogy as problematization "tracks the complex interaction of different practical vectors in their contingent intersection with one another so as to form problematizations" (108). These problematizations form the conditions of possibility of the present, and this brings us to Koopman's account of Foucault's Kantianism.

In articulating Foucault's debt to Kant, Koopman helpfully distinguishes between the general Kantian notion of critique and the much more demanding transcendental form of critique that Kant practiced in his own critical philosophy. Koopman insists that although Foucault engages in a Kantian project of critique as an inquiry into conditions of possibility, he does not attempt even a modified version of transcendental critique. Koopman also suggests -- not entirely convincingly, in my view -- that Foucault did not deny that transcendental critique was possible or desirable; he just didn't much care for it himself. Foucault was, on Koopman's reading, a much more thoroughgoing empiricist than most scholars have realized, and as such he was relatively uninterested in the deep philosophical perplexities concerning the relationship between the empirical and the transcendental that have stymied generations of German philosophers. Although he freely engaged in conditions-of-possibility talk, he always understood those conditions to be empirically conditioned all the way down.

The claim that problematizations are both contingent and complex leads Koopman in chapter four to a seemingly very simple but nonetheless important and highly original insight: that the point of genealogy is not only to demonstrate that our practices or concepts or norms or forms of life are contingent and therefore could be otherwise; genealogy also aims to show how those practices, concepts, norms, and forms of life have been composed through complex practices. Koopman argues that this aspect of genealogy is often overlooked or underappreciated even by Foucault's ablest defenders, who frequently take genealogy to be an exercise in denaturalization full stop. In Koopman's view, this is a crucial omission since "if genealogy helps us to see how our present was made, it also thereby equips us with some of the tools we would need for beginning the labor of remaking our future differently" (130). Koopman connects this to the thought that genealogy as problematization is neither vindicatory nor subversive but rather aims toward what he calls "responsive reconstruction" (21).

Armed with this characterization of Foucault's method of genealogy as problematization, chapters five and six re-read some of Foucault's major works in this new light. Chapter five focuses on Foucault's problematization of modernity. Koopman argues that this critique has often been interpreted in terms of a Weberian logic of exclusion and domination, according to which "reason dominates madness by totally excluding it, and . . . power dominates freedom by totally incorporating it" (163), whereas Foucault endeavored to make the rather different point that modernity operates according to a futile logic of purification, according to which reason is purified of madness and freedom of power. For Koopman's Foucault, this logic is futile because reason/madness and power/freedom presuppose one another in modernity; they are, in other words, "reciprocal and incompatible" (163). Hence, the proper response to Foucault's critique is not the liberation of madness or freedom but rather a "critical-experimental practice of self-transformation" (174). Koopman argues that this contrast between freedom as liberation, which Foucault regarded as deeply problematic, and freedom as critical self-transformation, which he offered as a reconstructive response to his problematization of modernity, accounts for his apparent ambivalence about the concept of freedom.

Chapter six delves into this reconstructive response in more detail, engaging Foucault's late work on ethics. Koopman thinks the idea of freedom as a critical-experimental practice of self-transformation offers a promising new ethical orientation, but finds the specific ethical commitments articulated in Foucault's late work -- to bodies and pleasures, aesthetic self-creation, and parrhesiastic truth-telling -- underdeveloped and thin. While these ethical commitments may be valuable at the level of personal ethical practices, they "have yet to yield a viable alternative to the much broader political-cultural problematizations we find ourselves facing today" (203).

That Foucault offered a reconstructive response to his problematizations of modernity suggests that he took the work of reconstruction to be compatible with his genealogical method. That his reconstructive response was ultimately unsatisfactory provides the impetus for turning to the nearby philosophical traditions of pragmatism and critical theory that can supply the normativity needed for reconstructive critique. This sets the stage for Koopman's final chapter. The overall argument of this chapter is that genealogy and pragmatist critical theory need each other because the former excels at the diagnostic work of problematization but fails to generate convincing reconstructive responses, while the latter excels at the anticipatory work of normative reconstruction but fails to offer compelling critical diagnoses of the present. Although Koopman aims for what he calls a modest methodological reconciliation between these traditions, he nevertheless endeavors to show that these methodological approaches are not, as is often thought, in principle incompatible with one another.

The supposed incompatibility of Foucaultian genealogy and Habermasian critical theory largely rests on the assumption that the former's commitment to the contingency of our beliefs and practices is incompatible with the latter's defense of the universality of our communicative practices and our moral norms. Hence, Koopman's methodological reconciliation turns on the possibility of reconciling contingency with universality. Here Koopman once again offers a seemingly simple yet nonetheless important insight -- that "contingency picks out a modality, and universality picks out a scope," hence, there is "no obvious (no necessary) contradiction in their being deployed together" (224) -- and then develops this insight into a compelling defense of contingent universals that are themselves the outcome of complex and ongoing processes of universalization.

It should be clear from this synopsis that this book makes a number of powerful and original contributions to the literature on Foucault. In my view, the most impressive achievement is the articulation of the concept of problematization as the master key to Foucault's method and thus to his oeuvre. This master key fails to unlock each and every door -- for example, Koopman's reading of the Foucaultian critique of modernity as distinct from the Weberian critique strikes me as less successful than other aspects of the book, since the distinction between the logic of exclusion and that of purification is hard to maintain. But in the main, Koopman succeeds in showing that genealogy is best understood in terms of the notion of problematization and that genealogy as problematization is best understood as an internal transformation of Kantian critique. Hence the book largely succeeds in achieving the two ambitious aims that Koopman sets for itself in the introduction. This is no small feat.

The book also makes an important contribution to the literature on Foucault's relationship to critical theory, though with respect to this aspect of the project, I think there are some unanswered questions that I hope Koopman will take up in future work. Partly this is a function of the structure of the book; the reconciliation occurs in the last, "concluding" chapter, but, at fifty-three pages, this chapter is by far the longest and most ambitious of the whole book. Doing justice to the issues and the material covered therein would probably require a separate book. In the space I have left, I simply want to raise two interrelated concerns about Koopman's proposed methodological reconciliation. For the record, I wholly endorse his aim of reconciling Foucaultian genealogy with a pragmatist version of Habermasian critical theory; I suspect, however, that accomplishing this goal is a far more philosophically ambitious project than Koopman seems to think.

My first concern has to do with Koopman's claim that genealogy is a backward looking history of the present whereas critical-theoretical reconstruction is a forward looking normative response (267). It seems to me that this characterization of critical theory overlooks the importance of Habermas's theory of modernity for his overall project. The theory of modernity as the outcome of a process of social evolution and historical learning plays a crucial role in underpinning the normativity of Habermas's approach; the communicative and discursive practices by means of which we assess the legitimacy of norms are, for Habermas, themselves justified insofar as they are the outcome of a historical learning process. Koopman attempts to downplay this aspect of Habermas's work by resting his interpretation on Habermas's later work -- from Between Facts and Norms onward -- but this strategy rests on the assumption that Habermas has given up his theory of modernity. However, it is far from clear to me that he has done so; indeed, I don't see how he can possibly give up on this theory, since his whole meta-normative strategy for securing the normativity of critical theory depends on it.[1] Hence, I would argue that there is an irreducibly backward looking dimension to Habermas's project as well, one that is at least prima facie fundamentally at odds with the Foucaultian genealogical method. Some sort of explanation of how these two very different backward looking approaches to history might go together, even methodologically, is needed.

Second, Koopman's point about contingency and universality is extremely interesting and insightful, but it seems to me that his defense of contingent universals generates a much more significant challenge to Habermas's project than Koopman suggests. After all, Habermas is not only a defender of universality at the level of first order, substantive normative theory, he is also a defender of necessity (though of a quasi-transcendental sort) at the meta-normative level. This is evident in a passage that Koopman himself quotes:

A moral obligation cannot follow from the so to speak transcendental constraint of unavoidable presuppositions of argumentation alone; rather it attaches to the specific objects of practical discourse, namely, to the norms introduced into discourse to which the reasons mobilized in deliberation refer.[2]

Habermas's argument here is complicated, and the details need not concern us here. The important point is that Habermas is clearly still defending the view that the presuppositions of argumentation are transcendental constraints on discourse, and that these constraints play a crucial role in the justification of the moral point of view, even if they are not by themselves sufficient for such a justification. I suspect, although I do not have the space to make the case here, that Habermas thinks that if we accept contingency at the meta-normative level then we collapse into relativism at the level of substantive normative theory -- though I'm inclined to agree with Koopman that this doesn't necessarily follow -- and that this accounts for his steadfastly resistance to all varieties of contextualism.[3] In other words, the idea of contingent universals not only challenges Habermas's account of universality, but also the relationship between his meta-normative (mainly epistemological and justificatory) commitments and his first-order normative principles. Accepting this idea necessitates a much more radical revision of Habermas's project than Koopman is willing to admit.

These questions are not meant to challenge Koopman's claim that Foucaultian genealogy can and should be reconciled with Habermasian critical theory, but only to suggest that such a project may not be quite as philosophically modest as Koopman claims that it is. Moreover, if Koopman hasn't given fully satisfactory answers to these questions here, this does not in any way detract from the significant achievement that this book represents. Genealogy as Critique breathes fresh air into a number of stale scholarly debates about the periodization of Foucault's work, the viability of genealogy as a method, and the relationship between Foucault and his interlocutors. It is a must read for anyone interested in Foucault and especially in the relationship between Foucault and critical theory.

[1] For example, in a relatively recent essay that Koopman cites, Habermas acknowledges that his justification strategy for the moral principle of universalization (U) "must be supplemented with genealogical arguments drawing on premises of modernization theory" (Habermas, "A Genealogical Analysis of the Cognitive Content of Morality," in The Inclusion of the Other: Studies in Political Theory, ed. Ciaran Cronin and Pablo De Greiff (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1998), p. 45).

[2] Ibid. Quoted in Koopman, Genealogy as Critique, p. 263.

[3] See, for example, Habermas, Between Facts and Norms: Contributions to a Discourse Theory of Law and Democracy, trans. William Rehg (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1996), chapter 1.