Genes and the Agents of Life: The Individual in the Fragile Sciences: Biology

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Robert A. Wilson, Genes and the Agents of Life: The Individual in the Fragile Sciences: Biology, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 312pp, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 052154495.

Reviewed by Marcel Weber, University of Basel



This book came out of a project on individuality in what Robert A. Wilson calls "the fragile sciences", which include psychology, cognitive science, and biology. The term "fragile sciences" is intended to express the fact that the objects of these sciences are "easily broken, delicate and admirable in their own right". One of the motivations behind this idea is to transcend the traditional division of "human" and "natural" sciences (not a new endeavor, of course; this was already Wilhelm Windelband's goal when he distinguished between "nomothetic" and "idiographic" sciences). Genes and the Agents of Life is a companion volume to the author's Boundaries of the Mind: The Individual in the Fragile Sciences: Cognition (also published by Cambridge University Press; NDPR review: But it is first and foremost an essay on the philosophy of biology and can be read and reviewed as such and independently of the companion volume.

The book is divided into four parts: Part One deals with individuals, agency, and biology, Part Two with species, organisms and biological natural kinds, Part Three with genes and organismic development, and Part Four with groups and natural selection.

Even though this is a book on the philosophy of biology, it starts with a question that has, to my knowledge, not been previously discussed in the philosophy of biology, namely: "What are the agents of life?" Asking new questions in the philosophy of biology deserves applause; however, for someone who has thought about biology quite a bit, the question comes as a surprise. An immediate response might be "I didn't know that life had agents." As the term is commonly understood, agency is attributed to things that are capable of acting, which might include a few animals, but not all organisms and certainly not mitochondria or genes. Wilson departs far from this common usage and sees agency all over the biological domain, from whole individual organisms like animals and plants through organs and cells all the way down to very small biological entities such as proteins and individual genes. So what does he mean by an "agent"?

Given that "What are the agents of life?" is described as the book's central question, Wilson spends remarkably little time in developing the concept of agent. According to one explication, "an agent is an individual entity that is a locus of causation or action. It is a source of differential action, a thing from which and through which causes operate". Furthermore, what is crucial for being an agent in Wilson's sense is "having a boundary, such that there are things that fall on either side of that boundary". So is a raindrop an agent, then? It is a locus of causation, for example, when it is acting as a prism (or falling on my head, to choose a more musical example), and it also has a boundary. On Wilson's account as presented, raindrops are agents, so we must keep in mind that his notion of agent is very broad indeed, to the point that I see no reason why we couldn't replace it with "thing" or "body" in many cases. However, certain systems such as the digestive system or biochemical pathways are also agents according to Wilson. Sometimes, agents "operate as biological mechanisms: they have functions to perform in the context of some larger agent, and in turn contain further agents […] that perform contributory functions". This is highly reminiscent of what some other philosophers of biology have recently written about mechanisms, and it invites the question of why we couldn't just say 'mechanism' in these cases. Why do we need agents in biology?

Perhaps the concept of agent in Wilson's sense allows us to see some kind of unity in the organic world, something that we will miss if we stick to the ordinary ontological categories such as things, bodies, and mechanisms. For example, some biological agents could form natural kinds. Indeed, in Part Two, Wilson defends the view that there are genuinely biological natural kinds, which he conceives as homeostatic property clusters in the sense introduced by Richard Boyd. Such property clusters, for example, distinguish living agents from non-living agents. Living agents are agents that have parts that are heterogeneous and specialized, include a variety of internal mechanisms, contain diverse organic molecules, grow and develop, reproduce, repair themselves when damaged, have a metabolism, bear environmental adaptations, and construct the niches that they occupy. This cluster of properties is "homeostatic" because there are mechanisms and constraints that cause the co-instantiation of these properties. On the basis of this account of living agents, Wilson develops a tripartite view of organisms. According to this view, organisms are (1) living agents, (2) belong to a reproductive lineage, some of whose members have the potential to possess an intergenerational life cycle, and (3) have minimal functional autonomy. The nice thing about the homeostatic property cluster account is that it would not mitigate against Wilson's tripartite view if organisms were created de novo in a laboratory (thus violating the second condition). For this view allows that something could lack one of the properties from the cluster without losing its membership in the category.

Also in Part Two, Wilson defends the view that biology contains natural classifications, in other words, that some taxonomic systems in biology classify natural kinds (including species). This applies not only to systematics proper, but also to the classification of cells and tissues in, for example, embryology (e.g., categories such as "neural crest cell"). Here, Wilson's arguments are cogent and his examples are well chosen. He opposes both the view that species are individuals, as well as pluralistic accounts of biological classification. Perhaps this is the strongest part of the book. Philosophers of biology who still think that species are individuals, as well as pluralists about biological classification will need to respond to Wilson's arguments. For he may very well be right that these views are "extreme reactions to the failure of traditional realism in the biological realm" and that his middle-ground position based on Boyd's concept of homeostatic property clusters provides "a plausible alternative to both the initial failure and these reactions to it." This holds also if the homeostatic property cluster view of biological natural kinds should not turn out to be the ultimate solution to this important and philosophically challenging cluster of problems.

In Part Three, Wilson turns to the role of genes in development, a topic that has gained much prominence recently in the wake of Developmental Systems Theory (DST). DST aspires to be an alternative to current thinking in developmental biology and evolutionary theory in that it denies any kind of privileged role to genes in the developmental process. In a similar spirit, Wilson reflects "on what, if anything, justifies the privileged role that the gene has traditionally played in the study of inheritance and the transmission of phenotypic traits across generations". Wilson's reflections begin with a critique of Lenny Moss's well-known claim that there are two distinct gene concepts extant in contemporary genetics, "gene-P" (for "preformationist") and "gene-D" (for "developmental resource"). According to Moss, genes-P are individuated by their ability to bring about a phenotypic trait such as blue eyes. By contrast, genes-D are individuated by the causal role they play in development, such as coding for a protein molecule. Moss claims not only that these concepts are intensionally different, but that there are no entities that are both genes-P and genes-D. Wilson objects to this claim, arguing that, even if not all genes-P are genes-D and vice versa, there are actually things that are both genes-P and genes-D, for example, BRCA1, a gene implicated in human breast cancer.

Even though he provides a lucid and critical analysis of Moss's position, Wilson fails to identify the real problem with it. The real problem is that there is no such concept as "gene-P" in genetic practice. "Gene-P" exists at best in poor popular science writing. Any closer look at real scientific practice will reveal that there is only one concept of the gene, that of a DNA sequence that determines the linear sequence of either RNA or protein molecules. "Genes for" certain traits, e.g., an elevated disposition to develop breast cancer are really elliptical expressions that -- admittedly -- scientists use sometimes, but that must be suitably interpreted. Namely, the "gene for" locution must be read in the following way: A "gene for X" means that there exists a trait X such that, ceteris paribus, the difference between two alternative states of the trait in a population is causally attributable to a difference within a single gene. The ceteris paribus clause is crucial here. The cetera will sometimes have to include the environment and other genetic loci. The reason is that differences in genes can manifest themselves differently (or not at all) in a different environment or when there are differences at other genetic loci (due to epistatic interactions). As long as this is understood, the "gene for" locution is perfectly fine. Most importantly, it has absolutely nothing to do with the concept of a gene. A gene is a stretch of DNA (or sometimes RNA) that determines the linear sequence of RNA or protein molecules, period. Everything is else is external to the meaning of the term "gene", at least as it is understood in actual biological practice.

As in the case of organisms, Wilson sees genes as agents that form a homeostatic property cluster. The cluster includes the properties of being a physically localizable developmental resource, being found on chromosomes, being a region of DNA that controls a discrete hereditary characteristic, corresponding to a single protein or RNA, encompassing coding and noncoding sequences, and being reliably copied across generations through reproduction. Since the claim is only that genes instantiate a cluster of these properties, examples of genes that lack one or two of these properties do not refute the account. However, even if this is taken into account, there are problems. For instance, do all genes really "control a discrete hereditary characteristic"? Most genes affect several characters, but I take it that this is consistent with Wilson's account (but it makes one wonder why he doesn't say so). But there could in theory be many genes that do not have this property (of course, they are much harder to find). How many exceptions can there be until the property cluster is refuted? Furthermore, many genes can make more than one protein because of alternative splicing. Again, this is not inconsistent with Wilson's account, but it makes the account slightly misleading. But the main problem is that Wilson neglects the fact that being a part of a nucleic acid molecule that determines the linear sequence of RNA or protein is a necessary property for something to be a gene (in the contemporary sense, which Wilson seems to be concerned with. The classical gene concept is different, of course). For all I know, it is also sufficient. So it seems that, in this case, we don't need the notion of homeostatic property cluster.

In a chapter on developmental biology, Wilson presents an original analysis of the way in which genes involved in the control of embryonic development are classified. The discussion focuses on the HOX genes, a class of genes first discovered in the fruit fly Drosophila but soon found in many other animals including humans. Wilson's main concern is whether classification of biological structures such as HOX genes is individualistic or externalistic. In other words, are biological entities such as HOX genes classified exclusively by their structure and their intrinsic causal powers (= individualism) or do external, relational properties also play a role (=externalism)? Even though parts of the chapter are somewhat confusing and could have been written in a simpler and more straightforward fashion, the author convincingly shows that individualism in the sense alluded to is inadequate. HOX genes are classified both by their structure and by relational properties such as the specific context in which these sequences are found. Two genes from different organisms are not counted as belonging to the same type simply by virtue of a high degree of sequence homology. You cannot be the same gene if you are from a different organism, no matter how similar you look. Even if their causal powers are constant across a variety of contexts, the taxonomy of genes is highly sensitive to the identity of their host organism. This strikes my as a very interesting example of classificatory externalism.

Adopting the DST perspective, Wilson argues that developmental systems in biology should be viewed much like cognitive systems in terms of wide externalism, which is the view that a system's states are individuated by factors that lie beyond the boundary of the individual system. This externalism is locational and goes beyond the externalism about classification that Wilson demonstrated by using the case of the HOX genes. Unfortunately, this demonstration for locational externalism is far less successful than his case for taxonomic externalism. The discussion is obscure and it is difficult to recognize any kind of positive argument in support of locational externalism. Wilson also over-estimates the extent to which DST is really a concrete research program that could produce tangible scientific results. Even though Wilson dismisses critiques to the effect that DST is nothing that researchers could put to work in the laboratory, his claim that there are a number of "active research programs within biology that can be understood through the lenses it [DST] has crafted" comes only with a footnote that cites some of the original expositions of DST. So is DST an active research program or is it a re-interpretation of empirical facts that everyone agrees on?

The final part of the book on groups and natural selection provides a stimulating discussion of the units-of-selection problem that has by now been part of the philosophy of evolutionary biology for a long time. Wilson is somewhat skeptical of what he calls "model pluralism", the view that individual as well as group selection models can account for natural selection processes, albeit while bringing out different aspects of the same process. Wilson develops a new position, arguing that different levels of selection are "entwined". This means that they do not make isolable, distinct causal contributions to the selection process. Entwinement puts a limit to the possibility of separating out the contributions of individual-level and group selection, or gene selection and selection on groups of genes by experimental intervention. Wilson suspects that entwinement is a result of a misleading metaphor, namely talk about "levels". Levels talk suggests that there is a compositional hierarchy that extends from the highest levels (e.g., species) to the smallest (genes). Wilson might have a point here, however, it seems to me that in some cases there is a compositional hierarchy, for example, groups are composed of individuals, or groups of genes are composed of individual genes. Thus, it makes perfect sense to ask, for example, if groups are sufficiently stable to act as causal relata in a selection process. This chapter contains a useful discussion of the case of selection for reduced virulence in the rabbit myxomatosis virus.

A recurring theme of the book is what Wilson calls the "cognitive metaphor" in biology, which he uses as a general term for cases where psychological properties are attributed to biological systems. Wilson thinks that this metaphor "operates behind the scenes in our conception of the organism […] Life and mind are not as readily dissociated as one might expect". While this is an interesting and provocative claim (somewhat reminiscent of Kant's philosophy of biology in the Critique of Teleological Judgment), unfortunately, Wilson does not do quite enough to show where and how, in biological research practice, the metaphor is really in operation. I do not doubt that there are such examples, in particular the use of information language in molecular biology. But we would have to see more of this in order to be convinced of such a radical and sweeping claim. Dawkins's "selfish gene" is really a pseudo-example, because it is a popular science book. Could it be that it is Wilson who has difficulties of telling life and mind apart, rather than practicing biologists?

Overall, Wilson has written a stimulating and thought-provoking book that brings a fresh perspective to many issues that have been occupying center stage in the philosophy of biology. Therefore, Genes and the Agents of Life deserves to be widely read by the philosophy of biology community and by anyone else who is interested in the philosophy of biology.