Genocide's Aftermath: Responsibility and Repair

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Claudia Card and Armen T. Marsoobian (eds.), Genocide's Aftermath: Responsibility and Repair, Blackwell Publishing, 2007, 278pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405148481.

Reviewed by John K. Roth, Claremont McKenna College


What can a book do, especially one by philosophers, to stop genocide and to mend the world after such atrocity happens? This question is all but unavoidable for the readers of either Genocide's Aftermath or this review, who can scarcely overlook the fact that genocide continues to rage in the Darfur region of Sudan, as it has done since 2003. Putting any book about genocide up against a reality of that sort creates a mismatch that does little to encourage the hope that writing about genocide can do much to check that atrocity or to heal wounds left in its wake.

Arguably, that judgment is particularly telling as one reads the essays in the volume edited by Claudia Card and Armen T. Marsoobian. Written primarily by philosophers, seasoned veterans and relatively young scholars among them, its contents for the most part appeared earlier in the journal Metaphilosophy (2006). It is unlikely, however, that the readership of those journal articles was large or influential as far as political policy is concerned. Nor is it likely that Genocide's Aftermath will have much of an impact on the world. I write that forecast with regret. My explorations about what philosophy can and cannot do in relationship to genocide and its reverberations have included the hope, if not the conviction, that philosophical writing about genocide could play a decisive role in curtailing that atrocity and in repairing its devastation. Although I grow less sanguine about those possibilities, the result is not despair. Like the contributors to Genocide's Aftermath, I have not given up on the belief that philosophy ought to have a key role in checking genocide and in mending the world it leaves behind. Nevertheless, the vast gap that yawns between the realities on genocidal ground and the analysis that philosophers typically choose to do, even when -- all too rarely -- they consider genocide, leaves me wondering whether the gulf is too large to be bridged. To clarify this perspective further, consider the style and substance of the chapters in Genocide's Aftermath.

Card and Marsoobian start their book well by observing not only that sound awareness requires viewing "modern history through the lens of genocide" but also that "an understanding of how to attribute responsibility for genocide and how to repair the evils perpetrated in genocides are two of the central moral tasks of philosophers." Those propositions are further focused when the editors add that what awaits the reader are chapters "primarily concerned with a conceptual understanding of the nature of genocide and how this understanding makes moral demands upon us to respond to genocide" (1).

Philosophers, especially those in contemporary analytic traditions, often claim special expertise in providing conceptual clarity. Philosophy's pride of place in this regard is not unjustified, but it is not entirely vindicated, either. Genocide provides a case in point. Ever since Raphael Lemkin coined the term genocide in the 1940s and it was more or less defined and codified in the 1948 United Nations Convention on the Prevention and Punishment of the Crime of Genocide, the meanings and boundaries of that concept have been contested. Grounded in the assumption that if thinking is clear and distinct enough then agreement on the proper meaning of concepts is at least possible in principle, a typical philosophical hope has been that humankind can "get it right" where the definition of genocide is concerned. Furthermore, the assumption continues, if we can accomplish that much, then the odds in favor of checking genocide, assessing responsibility for it, and grasping what should be done, and by whom, in its aftermath would be immensely improved.

Genocide's Aftermath embraces these assumptions and hopes. Much of the time, however, a reader -- at least this one -- is more likely to emerge with a sense of ironic skepticism than with persuasion that the book's claims, implicit and explicit, about conceptual and moral clarification are credible and reliable. Even if human thinking can "get it right" and produce an agreed upon, once and for all, definition of genocide, it is not likely that such a definition will "change the world." At least that outcome is not probable in the sense that genocide will ever end, because the powers that be -- remember Rwanda as well as Darfur -- will still contest how, where, and when the concept is applicable. That objection, of course, puts the cart before the horse, because another noteworthy factor is that analytic work on the meaning of concepts often promises more clarity and agreement than it delivers. These points, of course, do not entail that clarity and agreement about genocide are necessarily or entirely lacking. Despite Holocaust deniers, for example, evidence that the Holocaust happened -- and that it was genocide or nothing could be -- is overwhelming, and the acceptance of that evidence is widespread. Much the same can be said of the destruction of Rwanda's Tutsi population by Hutu extremists in 1994. Nevertheless, what may be intractable problems remain because attempts to clarify what genocide is and is not can scarcely avoid ambiguities that are unavoidable in concepts such as group or intent. They are only two that are intrinsic to the basic idea that genocide, whatever else it may be, involves an intended destruction of a group of human beings.

This book is fraught with dilemmas involving the tension between the desire for conceptual clarity and the frustrating elusiveness of what is sought. The editors' introduction is followed, for instance, by Card's "Genocide and Social Death," reprinted for at least the second time. Card not only explores how genocide destroys more than individual lives but also argues that social death, the destruction of vitality dependent upon "relationships, contemporary and intergenerational, that create an identity that gives meaning to life," is "utterly central to the evil of genocide" (10). Even while Card worked to identify what makes genocide a distinctively heinous crime, contending that "the special evil of genocide lies in its infliction of not just physical death (when it does that) but also social death, producing a consequent meaninglessness of one's life and even of its termination," she recognized that her view would be "controversial" (21).

Card was on to something important in her linkage of social death and genocide, including her self-assessment, which was right, too. What, for example, does it mean to say that social death is "utterly central" to genocide? Is social death a sufficient condition for genocide, or just a necessary one, or neither? When is social death an effect more than a cause of genocide? To what extent are generalizations about genocide possible? Can there be any one-size-fits-all where the relationship between social death and genocide is concerned? Philosophers are unlikely ever to be of one mind in their responses to such issues. Moreover, as they seek clarity about such questions, philosophers are likely to make more and more distinctions and qualifications, introduce more and more layers of theory. But it is unclear that the net result of this often technical work generates insight that can do much to intervene against genocide, to encourage significant assistance to those who have survived its onslaught, or to underscore memory of those who are beyond help, dead, and gone.

Genocide's Aftermath brims with conceptual analysis, including in particular essays by Mohammed Abed and Bill Wringe that assess Card's lead article. If Card is not always at the focal point, the book still tends to involve theorists in debate with other thinkers and outlooks. Karen Kovach's analysis in "Genocide and the Moral Agency of Ethnic Groups" relies heavily upon the sociological theory of Max Weber. Stephen Winter, in his essay "On the Possibilities of Group Injury," engages Joseph Raz and Larry May, the latter a contributor to the volume as well. Haig Khatchadourian writes on "Compensation and Reparation as Forms of Compensatory Justice," but most readers will be overwhelmed by his encounters with Bernard Boxill and John Rawls. As distinctions multiply and criticisms of other thinkers mount, abstraction grows as well, as in Rodney C. Roberts's "The Counterfactual Conception of Compensation." Ernesto Verdeja makes a fundamental claim when he says that "reparatory justice is crucial for societies facing a legacy of political atrocity" (181), but the account runs thin as far as any practical application of his theory is concerned.

If philosophy and philosophers are to make their best contributions to prevent or check genocide and to assist in the remembrance and restoration that are needed in societies ravaged by that disaster, they cannot rest content with concept clarification, internal debate, or theorizing -- important, characteristic, and even essential to philosophy though such activities may be. Where genocide is concerned, philosophy and philosophers need approaches that are more heads-up and hands-on. Fortunately, Genocide's Aftermath provides some significant examples of such philosophical work.

Card's essay on social death is one of those examples. Its lucid writing and close attention to the suffering inflicted by genocidal perpetrators shows that if one is serious about preventing genocide or healing in its aftermath, battle against the conditions that bring about or sustain social death must rank high among the orders of the day. Marina Oshana's perceptive discussion in "Moral Taint" also stands out. It produces a compelling picture of accountability that properly expands our senses of responsibility and holds our feet to the fire accordingly. Larry May's chapter on "Prosecuting Military Leaders for War Crimes" operates in related terrain. Not only is his discussion deeply immersed in historical data, something that philosophers always do to their advantage and ignore at their peril, but his account also admirably bridges theory and practice. Nir Eisikovits sheds important light -- critically and constructively -- on South Africa's Truth and Reconciliation Commission, arguing persuasively that it provides an example, transferrable at least in part, that "can promote sympathy between former enemies" (206). Pushing some envelopes in "Acknowledging and Rectifying the Genocide of American Indians," William C. Bradford uses his understanding of the destruction of Native American life as a case study that makes his readers confront the question, "Can we do better?" with regard to redressing genocide (233).

In the book's epilogue, "Reconciliation in the Aftermath of Genocide," Armen Marsoobian observes that social encounters among academics frequently include conversation that pivots around questions such as, "What's your research? Who are you working with? How far along are you?" (260). As one turns the last page of Genocide's Aftermath, the last of those three questions looms largest where philosophy's resistance to genocide and responses to genocide's devastation are concerned. With this book particularly in mind, the best reply to that question -- How far along are you? -- is found in either one or some combination of the following: Not very far. Just getting started. Needing to think things through some (or a lot) more, both in style and substance. Slowly but surely making some progress.

The best work in this book favors historical specificity over theoretical abstraction, depends more on descriptions of experience than on multiplying conceptual distinctions, and relies more on a direct encounter with genocide's horror than on intramural debates. If, and perhaps only if, philosophy and philosophers can build well on examples such as those set by Card, Oshana, May, Eisikovits, and Bradford, then the reply to Marsoobian's "How far along are you?" can be "Well on the way."