Georges Bataille: Phenomenology and Phantasmatology

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Rodolphe Gasché, Georges Bataille: Phenomenology and Phantasmatology, Roland Végső (tr.), Stanford University Press, 2012, 352pp., $25.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780804776073.

Reviewed by Shannon Winnubst, Ohio State University


The translation of Rodolphe Gasché's 1978 book on Georges Bataille is sure to become yet another of this remarkable scholar's interventions in our readings of twentieth century French philosophy. Organized around Bataille's complex development of a mythical anthropology, Gasché meticulously places Bataille's thought in conversation with Schelling, Hegel, Nietzsche and Freud. Framed by a fundamentally Derridean approach, unsurprisingly given both the author and the date of its publication, the text also engages Lacan at a crucial juncture, thus engaging Bataille through a rich philosophical lexicon spanning the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. For readers still unfamiliar with the texts of Bataille, Gasché's deft location of him in this long history of ideas aptly disabuses the longstanding Anglophone portrait of Bataille as merely a mystical, sexy, transgressive provocateur. Gasché brings the intellectual rigor and challenge of Bataille's thinking fully to the fore. As he insists in the Preface, however, this is by no means an introduction to the themes or arguments of Bataille: it is not a text "about" Bataille, but rather an attentive engagement of "the expenditure practiced by [Bataille's] mode of writing" (7). It is, we might say, an undergoing of Bataille's texts.

Given the deferral of this translation from its original date of publication, we may finally be ready for this book by Gasché. Unlike the 1986 publication of his first book on Derrida,The Tain of the Mirror, which David Farrell Krell recalls in this Foreword as leaving readers hoping "that Derrida would write a book explicating Gasché" (x), we scholars across the academy engaged in the various practices of explicating, analyzing, extending, and speculating about the myriad texts lumped under the moniker "twentieth century French philosophy" may finally be sufficiently prepared to engage the complexities and nuances of Gasché's text. In this vein, this delayed publication of a text written in the mid-1970s also offers a textual source of reflection on -- and perhaps even a metric by which to judge -- the development of scholarship in twentieth century French philosophy across the last thirty-five years. The text and its multiple axes thereby operate in at least three temporal registers: first, giving a reading that directs us to a thinker from the past (Bataille) in relation to other thinkers of the past (Schelling, Hegel, Nietzsche, Freud) while, second, offering a textual archive of "the linguistic turn"[1] that dominated Anglophone receptions of French philosophy in the late twentieth century and, third, providing fresh resources for contemporary scholarship going under the name of "new materialism" and possibly even "feminism." It is, in short, a book that everyone should read.

As an archive of the linguistic turn, Gasché's Derridean (and, at times, Heideggerian) reading of Bataille surfaces both implicitly in the deconstructive style of reading so often performed and explicitly in the consistent effort to shore up Bataille's vigilance regarding the pernicious and multiple forms of rationalism -- also once known as the metaphysics of presence. Accordingly, Gasché focuses on the play of various signifiers and etymologies, especially those circulating around mythology and phantasm, to show how Bataille wrests them from their subordinate positions in the history of western philosophy and metaphysics. As a performance of the linguistic turn, the text reads as a return to habits of early scholarship on French philosophy. And, in keeping with those long habits, one of the four historical interlocutors is decidedly not like the others: the specter of Hegel overshadows the text, yet again, when read through this hermeneutic lens. (This interpretation of the text seems to be what drives both the choice of English titles and the brief summary provided on the back cover, both of which characterize this book as focused on Bataille's interventions in the Hegelian schematic of phenomenology.) While this renders Gasché's text legible to this longstanding emphasis of scholarship (on not only Bataille, but on French philosophy more generally), it restricts the wealth of insights, analyses, speculations, and provocations to a line of thinking all too well tread. Put differently, if we only read this book within the confines of the linguistic turn and its fetishizing of Hegel, Gasché only offers a prolonged and insightful extension of Derrida's early and oft-cited essay on Bataille, "From Restricted to General Economy: A Hegelianism Without Reserve" -- an essay that long served as the only required reading on Bataille and that I hope we have outgrown. While shaped deeply by Derrida's essay and thinking more generally, Gasché was not bound by it in his reading of Bataille. Nor was Bataille ever bound by Hegel.

Alongside his Derridean readings of Bataille, therefore, I want to elaborate Gasché's persistent inquiry into a particularly enigmatic thread of Bataille's texts: base materialism, a figure and concept that defies any formulaic definition. To emphasize this set of thematics and their remarkable provocations, I turn away from the Hegelian problematics to the readings of Schelling, Nietzsche and Freud (Chapters 1-3) to offer a glimpse of the richness of Gasché's innovative work here. These are the chapters that show how Bataille continues to be an untapped resource in so much of our thinking today. They also show the generative prescience of Gasché's text, which offers fresh resources for thinking about a variety of contemporary concerns, especially those of new materialism, thirty-five years after its original publication.

Gasché turns to Schelling in Chapter One for one primary resource: the katabole. Without a single gesture towards reading Bataille as a neo-Romanticist, Gasché develops a meticulous reading of Schelling's work on mythology (ranging from an early 1793 essay to lectures of 1830-40 to Philosophie der Mythologie) to articulate as finely as possible the meanings of this figure that is forever lost, necessarily repressed in the ascendancy of German Idealism. Related to the twentieth century meanings of the metabolic function (catabolism) whereby molecules are destroyed and release energy to the organism, the katabole signifies the endless movement of an energy that must expend itself and, in so doing, render all formations unstable. With clear Derridean-Heideggerian overtones, Gasché portrays it as "a process in which 'something' is thrown away from itself in such a way that this throwing opens up a deep abyss into which it plunges. Thereby this 'something' becomes the ground, the foundation of that which now appears as the opposite of the abyss, that which is above it" (60-61). Calling it a "wild infinity" (75) that contrasts with Hegel's "bad infinity," Gasché links this Schellingian obsession to Freudian castration, but as "limitlessly extended" (78).

Connoting the kind of self-destruction endemic to conceptual architectures that becomes the hallmark of Derridean deconstruction, Schelling's katabole also leads Gasché to Bataille's abiding interest in the generative character of this kind of un-grounding of thinking in the epistemology of representation -- what Gasché cites Kristeva as describing as "Bataille's subversion of the two great semiotic units, ideology and knowledge" (14). It finally leads Gasché to Bataille's insistence on heterogeneity as the endless movement of non-logical difference, unmooring any epistemology of representation (108-110). We only experience the katabole as horror in Schelling. Gasché offers it as the impossible origin of Bataille's expenditures in all their horrifying, erotic and always alluring excesses -- a phenomenon Schelling calls "mythology" and Bataille calls "phantasms."

The second chapter is a turn to Freud, where Gasché shows how this Schelling-Bataillean figure of phantasm is something akin to unconscious fantasies (130). Distinct from image or fantasy as conceived in the faculty of imagination and from symbolism as it functions in The Interpretation of Dreams, phantasm as a Freudian unconscious fantasy "mobilize[s] infantile or primal scenes" (130). Using Freud, Gasché can show how Bataille's thinking about expenditure -- as a katabole -- accounts for the compulsion to reason as cathected by "rejected elements in the pit of the unconscious" (144), which leads to a kind of "virulence" and "rampant fantasy formations" (145). But he then goes on to argue that Bataille critiques Freud's phylogenetic account for the origin of these primal fantasies. Bringing the katabole to bear, Bataille sees that the question of the origin of these compulsively repeating phantasms that undo our systems of representation is unanswerable. Gasché deftly shows how the 'origin' is part of the staging of phantasms -- it is the endless movement and energy of the katabole, the ongoing imperative of expenditure. Arguing that Bataille exceeds Freud's lingering need for explanation, Gasché reads Bataille as pursuing the material conditions of the phantasm structurally, not phylogenetically or in terms of an origin. Gasché's elaboration of this structural account of the material conditions, particularly as refracted through Bataille's base materialism, offers many resources to contemporary scholarship in new materialism.

Finally, in Chapter Three, Gasché turns to Bataille's meditations on remorseless patricide, in contrast to both Nietzsche's and Freud's accounts, as an articulation of expenditure in the socio-psychic register. First arguing that "the development of an economy of expenditure is the objective of every one of Bataille's texts" (181), he goes on to offer a Lacanian reading of the reversal of Saussure's schema of meaning. This then allows Gasché to argue that, reading Bataille's texts as phantasmatic (that is, as enacting the katabole), we can see how they "allow the equlibirium and, thereby, also the equivalence of the signified and the signifier to collapse in favor of the signifier that cannot be sublated in any meaning" (183). Invoking the phallic function of the signifier in Lacan, Gasché then deftly moves to the question of patricide across the texts of Hegel, Freud and Nietzsche. First, and unsurprising to readers of Bataille, he shows how Bataille foils the idealization of the master in Hegel's Master-Slave dialectic through a championing of heterogeneity over the constitutive values of work and utility. It is then his moves to Freud's treatment of patricide in Totem & Taboo and Nietzsche's treatment of guilt and patricide in On the Genealogy of Morals that offer remarkable insights to not only Bataille's thinking, but also readings of Freud's and Nietzsche's texts. By emphasizing the remorseless character of Bataille's patricide, Gasché argues that we are able to undergo a position that offers no cathexis -- neither primary nor secondary identification -- with the father. He emphasizes, however, that Bataille nonetheless presupposes, rather than disavows, the Oedipal situation; accordingly, the patricide requires repetition, despite its remorseless apathy. The katabole thus becomes an endless movement of energy, bringing the heterogeneity of base materialism into all forms, with only apathy towards the ascendancy of rational, phallic meaning.

As a reader long intrigued by the position of sexual difference in Bataille's texts, I see in Gasché's argument a way to read Bataille as initiating a non-phallic order of thinking (and, perhaps, even representation). As he writes, "Bataille opens up a space within this [Oedipal] triangle through the squandering of the paternal function" (235). As he reminds us in his reading of Freud, the Freudian account requires that "the child's primary identification is with the mother" (225), albeit the phallic mother. If we read Bataille as squandering the phallic function, then Gasché's readings of Bataille through Schelling, Lacan, Freud and Nietzsche open a space through which to see how the katabole -- especially as the destruction, not mere repression -- of the feminine (figuring so often as base materialism) serves as the condition of possibility for signification, meaning, and knowledge. And this, in turn, opens the possibility of thinking otherwise, of thinking heterogeneously, acephalously, excessively -- just as Bataille always does.

When Gasché turns to Hegel for the final two chapters of the text, he returns once more to the katabole. Why, he asks with Bataille, did Hegel, this thinker of negation par excellence,hold the katabole at bay? As Gasché writes, "why did Hegel hold his ground against the power of death?" (249) The answer Bataille embraces is the fear of madness:

For [Hegel] the basis of human specificity is negativity, which is to say, destructive action. Hegel indeed recounted how, for several years, he had been terrified by the truth as his mind portrayed it to him, and how he thought he was going mad. This period of extreme anguish comes before the Phenomenology". (249)

Through this meticulous work of Rodolphe Gasché, we can see how Bataille refuses this fear of madness that drives Hegel to write the Phenomenology. Cathected by heterogeneity, not the power of the phallus, Bataille enacts the courage of his convictions, repetitively and across endless registers. One of history's grand ironies may turn out to be that, in so doing, this alleged pornographer turns out to be one of the most lasting, if very most difficult to embrace, resources for a feminist mode of thinking -- and living.

[1] Early Anglo-American receptions of French post-structuralism that interpreted it as enacting a "linguistic turn" often situated Bataille as the precursor to it. For an expansive account and critical appraisal of this narrative, especially regarding scholarship on Bataille, see Botting, Fred and Scott Wilson, "Introduction," Bataille: A Critical Reader, eds. Botting and Wilson, Blackwell Press, 1998.