Gerard Manley Hopkins and the Spell of John Duns Scotus

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John Llewelyn, Gerard Manley Hopkins and the Spell of John Duns Scotus, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 150pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474408943.

Reviewed by Thomas Williams, University of South Florida


"She is dissatisfied with her chapter on Gerard Manley Hopkins," says Harriet Vane of Miss Lydgate in Dorothy Sayers's Gaudy Night; "she feels she may have attacked him from the wrong angle altogether" -- as if to suggest that when it comes to Hopkins the only question is not whether but how to attack him. And surely there is something about Hopkins that invites attack: his experiments and innovations in prosody, his neologisms, the opacity of his language. All these features at least challenge the reader and, if they are not to invite attack or outright repudiation, require elucidation, sympathetic exposition.

There is something about John Duns Scotus too that invites attack. I speak here not of the Scotus who is attacked by such writers as John Milbank and Catherine Pickstock -- for that Scotus is "a fond thing, vainly invented" -- but of the actual Franciscan theologian of the late thirteenth and early fourteenth centuries. His Latin is barbarous, his arguments demanding, and his distinctions so subtle that one sometimes suspects them of being wholly evanescent. What is needed for Scotus too is elucidation, sympathetic exposition.

So in undertaking to discuss both of these formidable thinkers at the same time and in relation to each other, John Llewelyn set himself an unusually difficult task. Sympathetic exposition of both would have to clarify what is obscure, build explanatory bridges over breathtaking inferential or linguistic leaps, and mediate between two very different idioms of thought and expression. What Llewelyn has done instead, unfortunately, is to adopt a philosophical idiom that combines the most rebarbative elements of both Hopkins and Scotus. He strains after poetic utterance, indulges in frequent neologisms, uses technical language without explanation or definition. The style is a sort of parody of "continental philosophy" as it appears in the nightmares of unsympathetic analytic philosophers.

The disorderliness of Llewelyn's exposition -- key terms are never defined, or given incompatible definitions at different points; the connection between one paragraph and the next, even between one sentence and the next, is frequently indiscernible; etymologies (often bogus) are brought up for no apparent reason and then immediately forgotten -- makes it impossible to offer a summary of the overall argument of the book. Instead I shall note a few recurring themes.

The first is Scotus's notion of haecceitas, the ultimate formal principle in virtue of which two things of the same nature are distinct and unreproducible individuals. It is sometimes said that Hopkins's term 'inscape' is meant as a synonym for haecceitas, but Llewelyn denies this (13), and rightly so. Inscape is what is distinctive: in a poet's style, in an instrument's timbre, in the pattern and beauty of a particular flower or kind of flower. Inscape is therefore perceptible -- though only with difficulty, and by way of epiphany (69) -- whereas haecceitas is imperceptible, known only by inference.

"What I am in the habit of calling inscape is what I above all aim at in poetry" (23), Hopkins wrote in a letter to his friend Robert Bridges. But if that elusive quality of individuality, of the "personality" of something (69), is what Hopkins sought to capture and express in his poetry, and that quality is not haecceitas, what exactly is the importance of haecceitas to Hopkins? Llewelyn makes a great deal of the fact that Hopkins prefers to spell the word ecceitas, thus making it (or making it look like) a derivative of ecce, "behold"; so understood and spelled, the word "cross[es] performativity with constatement and hint[s] at an imperativity implicit in and disnominative of its abstract nominality" (94). If the ecceitas of things (which is beginning to sound like inscape after all) calls out to us, inviting or demanding a response, it is certainly not haecceitas, which can do no such thing. It begins to look as if Hopkins has taken up a word from Scotus without at all taking up the concept for which it stood.

According to Scotus, the individuating principle, haecceitas, is formally distinct from the common nature that it individuates. That is, the distinction between the haecceitas and the common nature in a given individual is not made by the mind, but simply recognized by the mind (it would exist even if, per impossibile, there were no minds to think about it); but the haecceitas and the common nature are inseparable in reality. The formal distinction is a second important theme in the book, and unfortunately it seems that Llewelyn has done with the formal distinction just what I said Hopkins did with haecceitas: he has taken up the word without taking up the concept.

For the formal distinction holds between items in the extramental world; it does not hold between thoughts or concepts. (For obviously no thought is inseparable from any other thought.) And yet Llewelyn frequently claims that there is a formal distinction between concepts. He also puts the notion -- or rather the expression -- to use in some of his most obscure and oracular utterances. For example: "The range of signification of the metaphysical common natures and of the logical universals stands in a relation of formal distinction both 'downward' with finite singulars and 'upward' with the infinite Singular of singulars" (39). What on earth could this mean? How could a "range of signification" stand in a relation of formal distinction to anything?

Or consider this:

We could say that for Scotus praxis is related by formal distinction to poiesis, and that both are inseparable from music, so that when in defining formal distinction he moves from less than numerical unity to numerical unity -- number -- he moves to metre, to measure and to music, which Hopkins takes as his model for poetry. (65)

Now Scotus has a long and elaborate account of praxis, which Llewelyn never engages with or even cites. I can hardly lay it all out here, but I can at least say that for Scotus it is the elicited act of will that is paradigmatically praxis (Ordinatio prol., part 5, qq. 1-2, n. 234). So if praxis were only formally distinct from poiesis, there could be no elicited act of will without the making of some product. That is obviously false, and Scotus would never say such a thing. And he certainly would not say that both praxis and poiesis are inseparable from music. Where does Llewelyn even get such an idea? Obviously there can be elicited acts of will -- obviously there can even be acts of making or producing -- that do not involve music. Perhaps if Scotus took music as a central metaphor or image for praxis, one could grudgingly let this statement pass as a carelessly hyperbolic expression of that fact, but he does not. Scotus hardly ever talks about music (though we do know that he thought he could be a good lutenist if he just practiced: Ordinatio III, d. 33, q. un., n. 60), and there is certainly no mention of music in the discussion of praxis in the prologue to the Ordinatio. Moreover, Scotus does not "move from less than numerical unity to numerical unity" in defining the formal distinction. The common nature, which in a given individual is formally distinct from the principle of individuation, has unity (it is one and the same common nature horse that is in the mind as the concept of horse and in a concrete individual horse as its nature) but not a numerical unity (because the common nature as existing in the mind is clearly numerically distinct from the common nature as existing in the horse). But neither numerical unity nor less-than-numerical unity enters into the definition of the formal distinction. And finally, numerical unity is not number.

A third theme -- central, I think, to the motivation of the book, but not made explicit until the next-to-last chapter -- is that of finding a "viable route" from the "metaphysics of God, existence and salvation" that both Scotus and Hopkins endorse "to the universes of discourse inhabited by the modern, postmodern or post-postmodern authors whose work is placed alongside that of Scotus and Hopkins in the chapters of this study" (108). It is, in other words, the problem of "writing a non-theological book about two theologians" (109).

Now one need not share the beliefs of a religious writer in order to write illuminatingly about that writer. Consider John Drury's wonderful book on George Herbert, Music at Midnight. Drury does not share Herbert's religious beliefs: but he writes about those beliefs and about their expression in Herbert's poetry with such insight and sympathy that I, who do share them, came away not only with a deeper appreciation and keener understanding of Herbert's poetry but also with a livelier sense of its devotional and theological power.

Llewelyn's aims are quite different. He seeks not to understand the Christian character of Scotus's theology and Hopkins's poetry, but, as far as possible, to erase it. Now in the case of the material in Scotus that is most relevant to Llewelyn's study, this is no great problem. One can talk at great length and with considerable sophistication about haecceitas and the formal distinction without ever touching on Trinity or Incarnation (though the converse does not quite hold). But Hopkins poses greater difficulties. Consider Llewelyn's treatment of the poem "As kingfishers catch fire":

As kingfishers catch fire, dragonflies draw flame;

As tumbled over rim in roundy wells

Stones ring; like each tucked string tells, each hung bell's

Bow swung finds tongue to fling out broad its name;

Each mortal thing does one thing and the same:

Deals out that being indoors each one dwells;

Selves -- goes itself; myself it speaks and spells,

Crying Whát I dó is me: for that I came.

"Not cogito ergo sum," Llewelyn comments,

but agere [sic] ergo sum, or volo ergo sum, 'I will therefore I am.' At least where the I myself is the mortal human self, the person as distinguished from the beings in the great chain of being for whom doing seems to Hopkins to belong to a lower 'grade' or 'pitch' of 'behaviour' (27).

But Hopkins makes no such distinction here, and implies no such distinction: kingfishers, dragonflies, stones, bells, and human beings all enact what they are. The burden of the poem is Hopkins's description of what human beings are, which Llewelyn does not quote here:

I say móre: the just man justices;

Keeps grace: thát keeps all his goings graces;

Acts in God's eye what in God's eye he is --

Chríst -- for Christ plays in ten thousand places,

Lovely in limbs, and lovely in eyes not his

To the Father through the features of men's faces.

Thus Hopkins gives powerful poetic expression to what St Paul says in Galatians 2:20: "It is no longer I who live, but Christ who lives in me." Even when Llewelyn does quote this final -- and, for its meaning, determinative -- part of the poem, some 36 pages later, he misses the point, preferring to see an expansion of the doctrine of the Trinity ("The Trinity becomes at least a trillionity") rather than an expression of the incorporation into Christ, indeed the identification with Christ, that is the hallmark of the life of grace.

But if Christ, and Christian belief, are to be kept offstage as much as possible, what will substitute for them? What is the "viable route" from Scotus and Hopkins to Heidegger and beyond? "We have based the chief hope of demonstrating some degree of relevance," Llewelyn says, "on the premise that God is Love, acknowledging that this premise promises or threatens to reimport the theology implicit in its scriptural place of origin" (117-118). And what does it mean to replace talk of God with talk of Love? Llewelyn explains:

The rule of substitution that licenses the equation of God with Love is a rule of substitution in more senses than one. It calls not only for a willingness to sacrifice one's selfwill for the sake (Sache) of the beloved. It calls also for the transcendence of divine grace by the immanence of a religious but not necessarily religioned attentivity of a willing not to will moved by the sheer existence of an individual or individuals other than oneself. (124)

But this is not to make Scotus or Hopkins relevant: it is to declare their irrelevance. It is to remove the Love of "Love bade me welcome" -- "the poem which Hopkins loved best of all those by George Herbert" (115), in which Love is the crucified and risen Christ. It is to remove the love that, according to Scotus, would have driven God to take our human nature upon himself even had there been no need to redeem the human race from sin and death. It is to have Hopkins calling out to no one when he says, "I have found the dominant of my range and state -- / Love, O my God, to call Thee Love and Love" (115). The "viable route" is not, then, viable after all. We have been offered, not a route from one metaphysic to another, but a replacement of one by another.


Drury, John. Music at Midnight: The Life and Poetry of George Herbert. U of Chicago Press, 2014.

Hopkins, Gerard Manley. Gerard Manley Hopkins: Poems and Prose. Penguin Classics, 1985.

John Duns Scotus. Opera Omnia, ed. C. Balić et al. Vatican Polyglot Press, 1950-2014.

Sayers, Dorothy L. Gaudy Night. Harper Paperbacks, 2012.