Gilbert Simondon and the Philosophy of the Transindividual

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Muriel Combes, Gilbert Simondon and the Philosophy of the Transindividual, Thomas LaMarre (tr.), MIT Press, 2012, 119pp., $27.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780262018180.

Reviewed by David Scott, Coppin State University


There are continuing appeals for English translations of Gilbert Simondon's richly complex works.[1] So the publication of Muriel Combes' book must be applauded.[2] Published in French in 1999, Combes' study is an inspiring work of pedagogical sensitivity. From the very first, scholars have judged it an invaluable guide for anyone wishing to enter the complex and labyrinthine world of Simondon, an enigmatic and somewhat elusive thinker. The sophistication with which Combes explicates and systematizes his baroque texts is admirable and a model to emulate. Indeed, she manages to upset the erroneous, but perpetuated, impression (largely resulting from the unavailability of authorized translations) that Simondon's relevance lies only in his being a supplement to more celebrated thinkers.

According to Combes, Simondon is "in a line of inquiry striving to think the political outside the horizon of the legitimatization of sovereignty" (48). Indeed, she makes clear that what prohibits most political and social theorists from fully grasping the relationship between the collective and the individual is precisely blindness to their own ontological presumptions. Combes bases her claim on Simondon's paradoxical hypothesis, which posits a "pre-individual being" as the condition for the emergence of the "psycho-social" field.

Combes argues that the primary antidote to the West's metaphysical amnesia is Simondon's theorizing a metastable and pre-individual "more-than-one." This "more-than-one" or Nature is undoubtedly at the core of Combes' commentary. It points to the fact that the individual is only ever incompletely individuated, only ever unfinished, only ever -- to some degree -- mutable and relational, a "reserve of becoming". Every individual is "more-than-identity" and "more-than-unity." For it is precisely the passing from the pre-individiual being to the individuated individual that Simondon names as the operation whereby the individual is constituted in the process of individuation or "ontogenesis." Combes emphasizes, therefore, that Simondon's contemporary relevance lies in the onto-genesis of the individual as problem -- a potential figment of the "more-than-one" -- which "remains [an open] question for philosophy only as a moment in becoming of being, a becoming that sweeps it along" (2). For such a phase of being [the individuated individual], given its metastable indeterminateness as the tenuous resolution of incompatibility between levels of being, takes us beyond the prescribed categories and questions endorsed by traditional liberal, moral, and political theories.

Now, we must not forget that what initially is at stake for Simondon are the grounds for reforming knowledge so that it correlates with the shift from ontology to ontogenesis. There can no longer be knowledge of individuation in the typical Kantian sense of the term. For how does one "grasp" being in becoming, individuation, without arresting it in the form of concepts, whose spatial and temporal consequences are already predetermined by the faculty of understanding? As Simondon writes:

Only the individuation of thought, in completing itself, is able to accompany the individuation of beings; therefore, it's neither an immediate nor mediate knowledge that we can have of individuation but a knowledge, which is an operation parallel to the known operation; we are only able to individuate, individuate ourselves, and to individuate in ourselves; this grasping is, thus, in the margins of knowledge properly speaking. (ILFI 36)

Simondon "transgresses" the Kantian limits of reason, Combes argues. He conceives an ontogenetic-epistemological structuring process, which operationally brings being and thought into a co-determinate relationship via individuation. Metaphysics and logic merge, so that "it expresses individuation and allows it to be thought . . . it applies to ontogenesis and is ontogenesis itself" (Combes 8; IL 33). She takes Simondon to extend the Nietzschean critique of Kant via Spinoza.

Combes writes, "Simondon situates himself before the rupture between the object to be known and the subject of knowledge" (7, my italics). What is this "before"? To be anterior to the object/subject distinction, is this not the very definition of the "pre-critical," that is, susceptible to the chaos of nature, such as Kant defines it? In other words, without this formal distinction, which would provide the conditions for critical analysis, which makes possible the judgment of knowledge, "reason is as it were in the state of nature, and it cannot make its assertions and claims valid or secure them except through war."[3] Simondon himself explicitly calls for the need to institute a "pre-critical ontology that is an ontogenesis" (IPC 206). And, while Kant is not mentioned, Simondon argues that the being of subject and the being of object arise from a "more primitive reality"; as such, "the conditions of the possibility of knowledge are in fact the causes of existence of the individuated being" (IPC 127). Consequently, the epistemological justification for what Combes identifies as Simondon's "realism of relation" is found in a metaphysics prompted by the indeterminate, metastable being of the pre-individual.

It follows that the most immediate challenge presented to the commentator is how to grasp in all its modalities what Simondon terms the "allagmatic". Our capacity to fully appreciate his ambition to rethink the history of philosophy depends upon how this notion is comprehended. For it is through its prism that we contest rationalist inferences, which are founded on the basis of their presupposing the existence of an individuated objective structure, i.e., 'objectivity.' Quite simply the allagmatic describes the genesis of the 'object', so constituted; as a result, it requires us to 'take a step backward', to the movement of modulation by which an operation becomes another by instigating the transformation of structures. Thus, this "general theory of exchanges and modifications of states" defines the conditions for the study of the genesis of the individual (the 'becoming of the being' of some thing or beings) as beginning not from some absolute commencement but rather from the energetic and structural conditions. In other words, "to know the individual through individuation rather than individuation beginning with the individual."

Combes' first chapter details Simondon's foundational metaphysics, especially, as addressed in L'individu et sa genèse physico-biologique, the fostering of the interchange between metaphysics and the sciences. By focusing on Simondon's most influential concept of "transindividuality," Her second chapter carefully extends these metaphysical implications into an ethics formulated on the basis of the ontology of relation (ontogenesis).

The psychic and collective are reciprocal individuations, according to Simondon. As such, for Simondon the transindividual names the systematic unity of the interior (psychic) and exterior (collective) individuations. However, it is not purely inter-individual -- at least in the manner phenomenology has defined "inter-individuality". Etienne Balibar (among others) likewise finds in Simondon's concept a way to bring to the fore the ontology of relations. It displaces the question of human essence to that of "constitutive relation", to those practices between individuals, which constitute the being of individuals. If, as Combes writes, "what defines a domain of being are not the substances filling it, but the functions born of the individuating doubling", then the transindividual is precisely what gives this "doubling" its name (28). And so, writes Balibar, all social relations as transindividual "are nothing but an endless transformation, a 'permanent revolution'".[4] Thus, the transindividual provides the necessary conditions for the possibility of the psychosocial or, as Balibar and Combes (in her final chapter) put it, "revolution".

Perception, emotion, solitude, anxiety -- for Simondon each of these ontic registers reflects the emergence of an ontology by means of the operation of transindividuality insofar as each discloses in its own way, a relation to the "obscure zone" of preindividual being. As already claimed, it is this zone that compels the passage from psychic to collective, while, simultaneously, constituting both in the process, to resolve, however tenuously, the excess of what is "more-than-individual". Simondon, as a result, requires and, subsequently, creates a new concept of the subject. The subject becomes nothing more than a "domain of transductivity", which Combes (explicitly borrowing from Foucault and Deleuze) suggestively describes in terms of a "folded topology", whereby the subject is but the phenomenal effect of the share of pre-individual being that constitutes itself in being forced into the transversal (transindividual) movement across the limits of the interior (psychic) and exterior (collective). "Before being structured, the collective is, in a sense, already within subjects, in the form of shares of uneffectuated nature, the real potential that insists within each of us" (51).

According to Combes, the critical analysis of work must become the "privileged site of human alienation in relationship to the machine, which has led to human alienation becoming the site for analysis of technics in general" (71). Simondon's claim is that "technical activity can be considered as an introduction to veritable social reason, and as an introducer to the sense of individual liberty" (IL 511).

Combes ultimate goal is to discover in Simondon's thought the grounds for a radical critique of work that is equally distant from the Marxist perspective as well as from certain sociological and psychological perspectives. Admittedly, Simondon's engagement with Marx (or rather with an abstracted conception of 'Marxism') is indirect and only obliquely evident in his work. As a result, Combes' nuanced and effective analysis is very much appreciated. Here is where we find her most significant analyses and her study's most far-reaching consequences. Ultimately, she argues that if Simondon must reduce Marx more generally to a pure economism, it's because he wants to hide the fact that "at the very moment he critiques Marx, Simondon is far closer to him than he thinks" (73). However, Combes' purpose is not to transform Simondon into some form of proto-Marxist. Rather, more subtly, she identifies the divergence between the two perspectives where separately each locates "alienation" within psychosocial and productive realities.

Simondon describes himself as formulating a "philosophy of nature". Once again, his motive is "to save us from impoverished conceptions of subject and object". But this time to what end? As a philosophy of nature, Simondon's thought situates the exploration of the processes of individuation in the transformations arising out of the pre-individual zone of indeterminate being, with each individuated being sharing this nature to different degrees. As Combes writes, "Nature in Simondon is not the objectivist operator of repression of the subject, nor is it opposed to culture or society . . . what he calls 'nature' is what renders social transformation thinkable" (54). The pre-individual is nature. As such, it instigates and nourishes individuation. Therefore, for the political to become thinkable requires our taking into account the pre-individual affective life or nature. And what is gained in rendering thinkable the immanence of psychosocial transformation? What is gained in grasping the movement of psychosocial transformation? In "naturalizing the collective" a new humanism is built on "the ruins of anthropology" (49).

In the resources of his philosophy of nature, Simondon finds a form of humanism that is capable of compensating for the alienation arising out of the growth of technological culture. Simondon's reformed 'difficult humanism' amplifies this new reality granted by a transformed relationship with the machine. Yet, here we find a perplexing oversight in Combes' work, for such humanism is possible only if an attendant transformed epistemology, registering the inadequacy of the subject/object distinction, is likewise realized. Simondon calls such an ontogenetic-epistemological correlate a "new encyclopedism". Diderot's and Alembert's Encyclopedia (1750-59), thusly, exemplifies the trans-disciplinary nature technical knowledge must assume in order to grasp being in becoming. At the same time Simondon holds that,knowledge conceives its goal to be the constitution of a universal and universalizing mode of expression. Combes' disregarding encyclopedism, therefore, evades both the historical and the ontogenetico-epistemological, motives guiding the formulization of each epoch's respective "humanism". This is the one error in her otherwise brilliant exposition. An awkwardness is quite clear, particularly if we acknowledge the unequivocal linkage Simondon establishes between encyclopedism and humanism. As he writes, "Every encyclopedism is humanism" (MEOT 101).

However, there is another potentially debilitating problem in Simondon's thought proper, which Combes directly confronts. Simondon (clearly mindful of Bergson) is careful to distinguish his position from finalism. Nonetheless, she wonders if Simondon has merely substituted an evolutionary, dynamic finalism for a static one. In other words, might Simondon's "evolutionism" not "take us far enough from the finalist schema of thought that places ends on becoming"? After all, the primary motive for his focusing on the genesis of the culture of technics is that it dramatizes how "becoming in itself bearing meaning or sense", reflected in the intrinsic normativity it contains, is capable of regulating the social. As Combes writes, "culture is to make humans recognize this virtual normativity in order for it to become effective" (63). Her concern, however, is that his "normalizing bias" makes it too simple to argue, despite his claims to the contrary, that Simondon "has not totally rid his philosophy of a substantialist conception of ethics in the form of having-to-be; he has simply displaced having-to-be onto having-to-become" (63). Immanence, as a result, would seem to be effectively normalized. Combes' critique threatens the ethical and political value, which she alleges is present in Simondon's principle of ontogenesis. A great merit of her text is that she offers a defense of Simondon's silence on this problem.

In conclusion, Combes sheds light on Simondon's incredibly complex thought, disentangles its principles, and clarifies the operational relationships between the concepts structuring its innovative perspective and outcomes. Even more impressively, particularly in the final discussion about "work", Combes lays the groundwork for the unique paths that his thought provides for grasping the fundamental relationship of the individual and the collective relative to their mutual and constitutive co-individuations. For this reason Combes (not to mention Thomas LeMarre and the editors of the MIT series) must be thanked for giving the English-speaking world an introduction worthy of Simondon's genius.

[1] In 1958 Gilbert Simondon's secondary thesis for his doctorat d'état was published as Du mode d'existence des objets techniques (MEOT). His primary thesis L'individuation a la lumière des notions de forme et d'information (IL) would not be published as a whole until 2005. However, the first part of his major thesis, L'individu et sa genèse physico-biologique (IG) was published in 1964. It would not be until 1989 that the second part, L'individuation psychique et collective (IPC), would be published. All translations from Simondon's texts belong to the reviewer.

[2] The reviewer's own forthcoming study on Simondon's IPC will be published by Edinburgh Press.

[3] Immanuel Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (trs.), The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant (Cambridge ; New York: Cambridge University Press, 1998) A 751/B 779.

[4] Etienne Balibar, The Philosophy of Marx, Chris Turner (tr.), ( New York: Verso, 1995) 33.