Giving a Damn: Essays in Dialogue with John Haugeland

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Zed Adams and Jacob Browning (eds.), Giving a Damn: Essays in Dialogue with John Haugeland, MIT Press, 2017, 373pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262035248.

Reviewed by Hans Pedersen, Indiana University of Pennsylvania


This volume is a collection of essays aimed at engaging with and extending the work of John Haugeland. Due to considerations of length, I have decided to take primarily a descriptive approach in this review, foregoing more fine-grained evaluation and analysis of the nuances of the articles. Instead, I will limit myself to some brief, general evaluative comments at the beginning.

This volume as a whole is an excellent example of philosophy that exists beyond the Analytic/Continental divide. Some essays lean more in the Continental direction, and others more in the Analytic. However, the reader will often find references to key Continental figures (primarily Heidegger, the main inspiration for Haugeland's thought, but also Hegel, Husserl, and Kierkegaard) seamlessly following references to recent leading figures in the Analytic tradition (Fodor, Brandom, Dennett, Burge, Davidson, etc.). In addition to the variety of philosophical sources from which the articles draw, there are also quite a few different philosophical sub-disciplines represented, such as philosophy of mind, philosophy of language, metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of science. (There may be more, depending on how one defines these categories.) While this topical breadth could make the volume feel disjointed, I think it works in this case, since all of the chapters are grounded in Haugeland's thought, which often seems to exist precisely on the borders of these different areas of philosophical research. It is this ability to bring in and synthesize ideas from so many sources that makes Haugeland's work so rich. Now, I do think that both of these forms of variety are strengths, but they also serve to make this collection a challenging read. While all of the essays individually are reasonably clear and written (presumably) with the non-specialist in mind, it takes a great deal of intellectual dexterity and background knowledge to move from reading, say, an attempt to further Haugeland's/Heidegger's account of individual identity to a detailed criticism of Burge's work on perception and objectivity. I readily admit that I found myself wanting with regard to background knowledge while going through this volume, but even though I am sure that I did not always appreciate the full import of the argument being made in a given chapter, I do feel that I was able to get something out of every chapter.

On that note, the introduction by the editors of the volume is extremely helpful. It goes well beyond the standard anthology introduction practice of providing short summaries of each chapter, instead providing a thematic synopsis of Haugeland's work. This synopsis leaves the reader well situated to better understand both Haugeland himself and the essays by the contributors. For me, as someone mostly familiar with Haugeland's work on Heidegger, the introduction made it clear (even when not mentioning Heidegger explicitly) how Heideggerian resonances were present in Haugeland's work in other areas, allowing me to both better appreciate what Haugeland and the non-Heideggerian essays were doing. I suspect the reverse would be true as well -- readers more familiar with Haugeland's work that does not explicitly reference Heidegger would gain better understanding of Heidegger's influence on Haugeland, and a greater appreciation for the Heideggerian chapters,by reading the introduction.

The first section includes essays that directly address the Heideggerian themes in Haugeland's thought. William Blattner takes up the issue of individual identity (or "mineness," in the Heideggerian lingo). As Blattner points out, it has been a key tenet of the "California Heideggerians" (i.e., Hubert Dreyfus and his prominent students such as Haugeland, Charles Guignon, and John Richardson) that our identities are constituted by the social roles that we inhabit. If our identities are constituted by social roles in such a way that anyone could conceivably fill the same role, then the extent to which we have any strong sense of individual identity becomes a serious question. Blattner proposes to answer this question by introducing the idea of role specification. According to this idea, agents develop a true individual identity, not by merely responding to the norms of the roles with which they identify, but instead by feeling called upon to enact the role in such a way that it is tailored to their own specific situation and background.

Steven Crowell also considers the importance of the "I-myself" (in his terms), but takes things in a different direction than Blattner. While Blattner is more concerned with the personal question of how I can come to be an individual in a strong sense of the term, Crowell is more concerned with the broader ontological importance of the mineness of existence. In particular, he explicates Haugeland's view that a "first-person involvement" or "existential commitment" is a necessary condition for the intelligibility of entities in the world. The general idea is that entities appear as meaningful only in light of commitments that we have made to various identities or roles. So, my books, computer, desk, etc., show up to me as meaningful only in light of my commitment to being a philosopher. Crowell tries to show how Haugeland's reading provides a middle ground for the understanding of entities in the world that neither reduces them to how they appear in our practices, nor takes the naturalistic path of completely discounting the role of our practices. Normally, entities appear within the context of our practices, whether these practices are scientific, or more practically oriented. However, Crowell points out that, for Haugeland, when we experience the total breakdown of the world in anxiety and being-towards-death, entities are still there, but now have the character of "essential unintelligibility" (92). In other words, in these states, entities appear as brute existents, but lack the significance that our practices let appear. So, there is a sort of non-norm-based objectivity for Haugeland that can keep his view from sliding into one which is more anti-realist than might be desirable.

Rebecca Kukla begins by stating that she is motivated by Haugeland's claim that philosophy is " just a particularly sophisticated and elaborate form of ostension" (103). That is, "we use philosophical discourse to direct one another's attention to how things are" (103). Kukla wants to push this idea further by following Heidegger and maintaining that all discourse has an "essential ostensive component" (104). The other main way that Kukla wishes to expand on Haugeland's ideas is to argue that ostension is always essentially social; it is directed towards others and attempts to direct them to encounter and grasp the object being discussed. To use Kukla's example, ostension could have the very simple form of saying, "Lo, a rabbit!" On the other hand, ostension might have the very complex form of Heidegger's philosophy, which, to invoke the old Husserlian catchphrase for phenomenology, tries to direct us towards an encounter with the things themselves. Kukla maintains that predicative assertions are also essentially ostensive, insofar as they direct the other to a particular characteristic of the object under discussion. This all leads to some important and interesting implications. Kukla argues that the traditional problems surrounding reference and the correspondence theory of truth dissolve if one takes her ostensive view of discourse and assertion. On her view, there is no longer a puzzle about how representations expressed in language can refer to objects in the world. Discourse is not about expressing representations at all, but is rather a way of pointing the listener to something in the world that "may already have been available and uncovered, in the sense that our shared public interpretation gives it salience and significance" (118). Similarly, there has been the traditional problem with thinking of truth as correspondence between a proposition or mental representation and the relevant object. How could a proposition ever be sufficiently like the object to which it refers to count as truly corresponding to it? Again, the problem dissolves on Kukla's view, since assertion aims to direct attention, not correspond in some way to the entity being pointed out.

Joseph Rouse , in his bluntly, but appropriately, titled chapter, "Love and Death," attempts to tease out the importance of love and death for Haugeland's thought. Rouse starts with Haugeland's claim that "love is the mark of the human" (132), as opposed to the traditional idea that it is our enhanced capacity for reason that separates us from other animals. Other animals might very well desire things encountered in the environment that they perceive as beneficial for them. Insofar as they do, they exhibit what Rouse calls a "narcissistic intentionality" (138). This sort of intentionality is, of course, a feature of human existence as well, but Rouse contends that the capacity for love is connected to a different sort of intentionality. There is also the possibility of an intentionality that "involves letting oneself be open to entities in their own range of possibilities, rather than merely those we project on them or need from them," and it is love that lets the "beloved change oneself and one's sense of possibilities" (144). This openness to changing one's view in response to things encountered in the world is critical to Haugeland's concept of ontological responsibility -- actually being faithful to entities as encountered. Rouse's discussion of death picks up from there. Death, for Haugeland, is the "collapse of an understanding of being," i.e., the point at which proceeding in our current understanding of world becomes an impossibility (145). As we have already seen in Crowell's essay, this is an important moment for Haugeland. In this sort of existential death, we are forced to abandon those of our practices that no longer allow us to experience entities as they are, so that we can open ourselves again to encounter entities on their own terms. This is the connection, then, between death and love. Upon existential death, we have the possibility of being open to entities and being capable of being changed by them, if we have the right sort of intentional stance towards them.

I am not sure that the middle two sections of the book hang together as well thematically as the first and last sections do, but I know it is hard for collections of essays of this sort to have a perfect thematic structure and do not take this as a serious drawback. For the sake of keeping this review to a manageable length, I will be giving even shorter shrift to the articles in these two sections. This should not be seen as a comment on their quality, but rather as a necessary and regrettable sacrifice to allow for a fuller discussion of the section on Haugeland's previously unpublished work included later in the volume. With that said, the next section contains two essays under the heading of "Embodiment." In the first, Mark Lance attempts to sketch an account of how semantic content can be built up from a pre-linguistic, embodied coping with our environment. In the other article, Danielle Macbeth takes up the conflict between the Aristotelian view that meaning is inherent in the natural world and the Cartesian view that the natural world is a system of merely causal relations without inherent meaning. Macbeth suggests that we find a middle ground between these positions that recognizes human (and animal) existence as forming an irreducible unity with the world. In other words, it is not the case that we merely construct any meaning to be found and project it upon the world; nor is it the case that we passively receive meaning written into the world around us. Our engagement with the world is "ineluctably mediated, by our biological, sociocultural, and intellectual form of life" (204).

The other middle section is composed of three essays under the heading of "Intentionality." The first is by Bennett W. Helm and, like the essays from Crowell and Rouse, deals with Haugeland's account of how individual existential commitment is connected to truth. While Helm is generally sympathetic, he does think that Haugeland is missing something essential. In particular, Helm makes the case that if we want an account of objective truth, there needs to be a fundamental commitment to being part of a community where members hold each other responsible for their beliefs, and it is this communal aspect that Haugeland leaves out. If entities are what they are by virtue of the norms that govern their activities, then there seems to be nothing to stop someone from simply claiming that they have committed to a different set of norms than the common public ones, and thus have a different "truth" with regard to these entities. (Helm uses the example of someone who makes up new rules in chess, redefining what pieces can do, and thus redefining what they are.) For Helm, "what is needed for existential commitment to public objectivity is that we be answerable to each other: I cannot escape your criticism simply by claiming to inhabit a different 'science world' than you do" (222). Zed Adams and Chauncey Maher also deal with the question of objectivity through an in-depth engagement with Tyler Burge's account of objectivity and perception. In the final chapter in this section, John Kulvicki attempts to work out an ontology of recordings. That is, he raises questions about what recordings (e.g., videos, pictures, audio tapes) are. Are they representations of objects? Are they mere copies of objects? Can we say that recordings exhibit intentionality in some sense?

The final section is dedicated to Haugeland's "Two Dogmas of Rationalism." This essay appears in its entirety, and is followed by responses from John McDowell and Mark Lance. This group of essays plays out some of the main issues in the Dreyfus/McDowell debate over the role of conceptual content in our perception and general engagement with the world. Haugeland provides an argument for the Dreyfusian position that much of modern philosophy ("modern" both in the sense of the historical era starting with Descartes, and in the sense of current analytic philosophy) wrongly gives too much weight to the role of explicit mental content. In particular, Haugeland argues that positivism and cognitivism are two unquestioned assumptions underlying the rationalism that continues (in his view) to pervade current analytic philosophy. He defines positivism as the view that "reality is 'exhausted' by the facts -- that is, by the true propositions," and expands on this by adding, "this needn't mean that there are no things, properties, or relations, but only that these are intelligible only as constituents of true propositions" (293). To find salient counter-examples to positivism thusly defined, Haugeland analyzes scientific know-how and scientific laws, seemingly with the thought that a decisive blow will be dealt to positivism if scientific knowledge, the form of knowledge which shares the widest consensus regarding its legitimacy, can be shown to be non-propositional in certain aspects. Haugeland claims that, in order for scientific knowledge to exist in propositional form as a brute fact about the world, we must first acquire scientific know-how -- the knowledge of "how to make or perform the observations, measurements, and experiments that yield the factual evidence" (296). This know-how cannot itself be reduced to propositional form. It is "about" the world in some sense, since it involves engaging with the world around us in such a way as to yield facts about this world, but is not itself a fact that can be laid out in propositional form. Next, Haugeland considers scientific laws, defining them as "necessary facts," establishing an important connection to modal logic (298). He then suggests that modal claims involving necessity can be thought of not only as propositions, but also as performative speech acts, as involving an agent taking a stand by asserting that some event or pattern of events is necessary. With regard to scientific laws, "to take a proposition as a law just is to insist or require that empirical results be compatible with it" (307). That is not to say that we should reject out of hand any empirical results that are not compatible with scientific laws, but that rather our first impulse should be to investigate why these results are anomalous (a bad experimental set-up, miscalculation in the data analysis, etc.).

Moving on to the second "dogma," Haugeland defines cognitivism as the view that "reason is to be understood in terms of cognitive operations on cognitive states," where a cognitive state is "something with propositional content (such as a mental representation) together with a cognitive attitude toward that content (such as deeming or wanting it to be true)" (301). Again, Haugeland's strategy in arguing that this view is in fact a mere dogma is to consider another aspect of scientific knowledge. Here he makes use of the distinction between explanation and understanding. He argues that, while the paradigm of scientific reason is explanation as a cognitive process, understanding is something different, something not able to be analyzed in terms of the normal components of cognitive states. Explanation is "showing how the actual can be grasped in the light of the modal [i.e., in the light of necessary scientific laws]," while understanding is "noticing, or at least tracking, some nontrivial pattern or structure of relationships in the phenomena" and "appreciating that it is possible and/or necessary, in a way that others, superficially similar to it, would not be" (304-305). So, it seems that understanding is the recognition of the necessary law itself emerging out of the empirical data, while explanation is being able to take a given set of data and show how it occurs in accordance with the necessary laws. Haugeland maintains that this sort of understanding need not be articulable in propositional form.

Unsurprisingly, McDowell's response to Haugeland is largely critical. McDowell provides a somewhat detailed account of Kant's Transcendental Deduction as a means of undermining Haugeland's argument against positivism. Following Kant (and rehearsing an argument similar to that from his own earlier work), McDowell maintains that truly objective propositional knowledge (like that provided by the synthetic judgments of the understanding, in Kantian terms) is only possible if the conceptual content of the propositions is already there in the objects of experience encountered in the world. Otherwise, there would be an unbridgeable gap between the non-conceptual content of the manifold of sensations and the concept-laden propositions that we form about the world. For McDowell, the "idea of the forms of reality and the idea of the forms of thought are just two guises of a single idea" (320). In other words, on McDowell's version of positivism, it is not the case that we come up with a set of propositions that we designate to be the sum total of facts that constitute the world, and then try to impose this upon the brute world of our experience. Rather, we develop this set of propositions by articulating our already concept-laden perception of the world. Responding to Haugeland's counter-example of scientific know-how, McDowell maintains that this sort of know-how can be put in propositional form, even if it does not rely on an explicit understanding of relevant concepts. He states that a "skilled scientific investigator knows that one can acquire knowledge and understanding of worldly phenomena by following such and such investigative procedures" (emphasis added, 321). McDowell finds Haugeland's accusation of cognitivism something of a straw man. He agrees that rationalism would certainly be an unattractive position if it were in fact committed to cognitivism as Haugeland defines it, but McDowell sees no reason that rationalism must "saddle itself with a pinched and shallow conception of reason" (323). "The remedy," says McDowell, "is not to abandon rationalism but to liberalize our conception of reason" (324). Ultimately, then, McDowell suggests that we consider the view Haugeland is advocating not as a "postrationalist epistemology," but instead as an "improved rationalism, free of the dogma of cognitivism but still characterized by a version of positivism" (327).

Mark Lance's response to Haugeland is more sympathetic, but still somewhat critical. Lance separates Haugeland's claims about positivism into a metaphysical claim and an epistemological claim. The metaphysical claim is that the world just is the sum total of true propositions, something which Lance thinks is obviously false and not a view worth considering seriously. Haugeland is, on Lance's view, again arguing against a straw man here. The epistemological claim, which Lance finds to be more plausible, and hence more worthy of arguing against, is that "there is some set of propositions such that a complete understanding of the world would be constituted by knowledge of each element of the set" (330). In defense of Haugeland's argument against this sort of epistemological positivism, Lance refers to his work done with Rebecca Kukla on ostensive speech acts, which she touches upon in her chapter. He maintains that even the simplest form of ostension (e.g., "Lo!") expresses an understanding of the world and attempts to direct the attention of the listener to a specific phenomenon, but that neither this understanding, nor the recognition of the listener, is reducible to propositional form. Lance also agrees with Haugeland's suggestion that the performative aspect of asserting necessary laws provides a counter-example to epistemological positivism, and wishes only that Haugeland had pushed this point further.