God and Design: the Teleological Argument and Modern Science

Placeholder book cover

Manson, Neil (ed.), God and Design: the Teleological Argument and Modern Science, Routledge, 2003, 400pp, $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415263441.

Reviewed by Niall Shanks, East Tennessee State University


This volume consists of nineteen essays devoted to the merits and failings of the argument from design from the standpoint of modern science. The contributors include distinguished scientists, philosophers and an assortment of creationists – a veritable mix of the good the bad and the ugly. For the present I note that the volume is divided into four parts. Part 1 is concerned with the characteristics of the argument from design, part 2 with physical cosmology, part 3 with the multiple universes hypothesis, and part 4 with biological versions of the argument from design.

The volume opens with an essay by Elliot Sober that provides a clear characterization and critical analysis of the various forms of the argument from design. The argument has biological and cosmological variants, and these need to be sharply differentiated. Sober raises critical points against both the biological and the cosmological (“fine tuning”) versions of the argument from design. This essay is followed by John Leslie’s reflections on the meaning of design. Where Sober’s essay was rooted in rigorous analysis of the structure of arguments trading in probabilities, Leslie’s essay is rooted in more traditional philosophical concerns about the nature of God-the-designer. Robert O’Connor’s essay considers claims by contemporary intelligent design theorists that their latest versions of the argument from design go beyond traditional versions from the standpoint of scientific respectability and philosophical presupposition. He draws a useful distinction between loca- design arguments and globa- design arguments. The latter try to infer design from the very presence of life in the universe, whereas the former try to infer intelligent agency and design from facts in the domain of contemporary science (for example, the biochemical pathways that have bewitched creationists such as Michael Behe). O’Connor’s conclusion is that notwithstanding claims to the contrary, the new intelligent design arguments are nothing more than old creationist wine in new designer-label bottles.

The first part of the anthology also contains essays by Jan Narveson (critical of the design argument), Del Ratzsch (who explores a perceptual, non-inferential approach to the evidences for design rooted in the philosophy of Thomas Reid), and Richard Swinburne (who supports the design argument on the basis of (uncalculated and unsupported) claims concerning the improbability of atheism). To give you a taste for Swinburne’s style of argumentation: he comments of the multiple-universes hypothesis favored by some cosmologists, “Rational inference requires postulating one simple entity to explain why there are many complex entities. But to postulate many complex entities to explain why there is one no less complex entity is crazy” (p. 117). While there is no reason (certainly none provided by Swinburne) to suppose that the postulation of a supernatural designer is either simple or even coherent, it is far from clear that Swinburne is right about the requirements of rational inference. After all, we believe complex objects such as tables are made up of vast multiplicities of atoms. These are objects with complicated internal structures and incredibly complex mutual interactions, as any quantum chemist or quantum field theorist knows. Not since the eighteenth century have scientists tried to explain the complex manifestations of matter – water, for example – by postulating a simple, elemental substance!

I turn now to part 2 of the anthology. This section of the book is concerned primarily with cosmological versions of the argument from design. In the comic novel Right Ho, Jeeves by P. G. Wodehouse, the immortal Bertie Wooster, himself no great genius, described an acquaintance, Miss Madeline Bassett as follows, “her conversation, to my mind, was of a nature calculated to excite the liveliest suspicions. Well, I mean to say, when a girl suddenly asks you out of a blue sky if you don’t sometimes feel that the stars are God’s daisy chain, you begin to think a bit.” The disputes about the cosmological versions of the argument from design are essentially disputes between those who think that the stars (or the fundamental cosmological constants …) are God’s daisy chain, and those who are frankly skeptical.

Physicist Paul Davies opens this part of the anthology with a discussion of the appearance of design in physics and cosmology. The essay is largely speculative in nature, and Davies contends (though he does not argue) that the emergence of life and consciousness were somehow written into the basic laws of nature (he knows not how). Reading this essay one cannot help but feel that Davies should stick to his field of expertise – quantum gravity – and leave metaphysics to those who at least have some arguments up their sleeves.

This essay is followed by William Lane Craig’s ruminations on the anthropic fine-tuning of the universe. Put bluntly, many numbers appear in the standard cosmological model that are not predicted by basic theory but have to be fixed empirically. If these numbers were slightly different, then we would not be here for the universe would be inhospitable to our kind of life. Craig (and numerous others) see this fine-tuning of nature’s constants as evidence of providential design. On the face of it, this is a colossal argument from ignorance: we currently do not have a good physical theory that explains why nature’s constants take the values they do, so they must have been fixed by God.

In responding to the claim that the postulation of a providential designer only pushes the problem back one step (what then explains the designer), Craig argues, “It is widely recognized that in order for an explanation to be the best, one need not have an explanation of the explanation… If the best explanation of a disease is a previously unknown virus, doctors need not be able to explain the virus in order to know that it caused the disease” (p. 175). As Craig must surely be aware, the hypothetical virus only becomes the best explanation after independent evidential warrant for its postulation is forthcoming from empirical medical and virological inquiries (“It enters the body this way…”, “It parasitizes intracellular mechanisms this way…”, “It propagates this way….,” and so on). Until these inquiries are conducted, the viral hypothesis for the cause of a disease is an unsubstantiated hypothesis that explains nothing. Postulating a hitherto unknown supernatural being simply to explain the fine tuning of the universe, with no further evidence of mechanism and details, is mere idle speculation.

Craig’s essay is followed by essays by Robin Collins (supportive of claims about fine-tuning in the face of skeptics such as Steven Weinberg); and by Timothy McGrew, Lydia McGrew, and Eric Vestrup (skeptical about the role played by probabilities in fine-tuning arguments).

Part 3 of the anthology is concerned with the “multiple universes” hypothesis as a non-supernatural device to explain the anthropic coincidences. This section opens with an essay by astrophysicist Sir Martin Rees. Rejecting explanations of fine-tuning in terms of either chance or providential design (and, for that matter, ignoring that the apparent need for such explanations arises from the current incomplete state of cosmological science), Rees suggests that the fine-tuning could be explained by the postulation of many universes (in which the laws and physical constants differ from those obtaining in our universe). Our universe, far from being either designed or being a freak of nature, would then belong to a subset of the set of universes that offered habitats conducive to the emergence of complex life and consciousness. The basic idea is as follows: the probability of rolling a fair die five times and getting five 6s in a row is very small (0.00013). But if you have many millions of people rolling dice, there will be thousands, who, by chance alone, will roll five 6s in a row.

Personally I find the postulation of multiple, unobservable universes to be less than compelling. The probability that you get five 6s in a row in a given trial involving five rolls of the die may be 0.00013. But this same probability attaches to any other sequence outcomes from five rolls of the die (e.g., two 5s, a 4, and two 2s). This probability, moreover, tells us nothing about when, in a sequence of trials, each involving five rolls of the die, you will get five sixes. Perhaps it happens in the first run of five rolls of the die, perhaps in the twenty -seventh. That you anthropically care about five 6s in a row – perhaps you get a prize – hardly merits the postulation of either natural or supernatural entities in a realm invisible.

D. H. Mellor’s essay also expresses skepticism about the “multiple universes” hypothesis. Mellor questions whether it offers an explanation of our existence. In ostensibly dealing with the question “Why do we exist?” in terms of multiple universes, Rees seems to answer another, very different question (i.e., “Why do we exist where we exist?”). As Mellor observes, “to change the question in this way is like turning the question of why there are fish (say) into the question of why they live where they do, namely in water: to which the obvious answer is that water, unlike dry land, has what fish need” (p. 223).

Roger White’s essay continues the exploration of fine-tuning and the explanatory value of multiple universes. I find myself uneasy with White’s conclusion that “assuming there is just one universe, the fact that it is life-permitting is surprising. For this otherwise extremely improbable outcome of the Big Bang is more probable on the assumption that there is a cosmic designer who might adjust the physical parameters to allow for the evolution of life” (p. 243). Physicists know virtually nothing about the details of the instant of the Big Bang (as opposed to what happened a miniscule fraction of a second later). It is hard to say what is probable and what is not. Nothing follows about nature from our ignorance of it. That you can tell a theological science-fiction story about cosmic designers tweaking cosmological parameters hardly renders the existence of a single, life-permitting universe more probable than otherwise. It would be different if we had some independent evidence that there was such a being with the requisite wherewithal, but we do not.

White’s essay is followed by a piece by creation scientist William Dembski. Dembski’s work has been widely criticized elsewhere, and I will not rehearse those criticisms here.

While I share Dembski’s unease with the postulation of multiple universes, I find his counter-proposal to be deeply problematic: “We already have experience of human and animal intelligences generating specified complexity… Thus, when we find evidence of specified complexity in nature for which no embodied, reified or evolved intelligence could plausibly have been involved, it is a straightforward extrapolation to conclude that some unembodied intelligence must have been involved. Granted, this raises the question of how such an intelligence could coherently interact with the physical world. But to deny this extrapolation merely because of a prior commitment to naturalism is not defensible” (pp. 266-267). The problem here lies not with a prior commitment to naturalism, but with Dembski’s failure to adequately address the question of coherent interaction between the physical realm and the nonphysical realm, for unless this matter is properly dealt with, the extrapolation he envisions is in fact highly problematic. That evolved physical beings such as ourselves can design complex artifacts is evidentially irrelevant to the issue as to whether there are nonphysical supernatural beings who can design universes – objects that are, on the face of it, very different from the artifacts of human experience.

Finally we arrive at Part 4 of the anthology, which involves essays devoted to the issue of intelligent design in biology. Michael Behe opens this section with a discussion of the modern intelligent-design hypothesis. Behe, like Dembski, has been widely criticized in other forums, and Behe’s essay is followed here by an excellent critical essay by Kenneth Miller which does much to dismantle his uncritical speculations about biological intelligent design.

Behe’s strategy is to point to known features of biochemistry and to argue that since there is currently no obvious way (given our present state of knowledge) in which these systems could have evolved (we are ignorant of how they came to be – though not as ignorant as Behe would have you believe), then they must be fruits of intelligent design. This is essentially the same pattern of inference underlying the leap from our ignorance of the details of fine-tuning to the conclusion of supernatural design.

Michael Ruse’s essay on modern biology and the argument from design is perhaps one of the best essays in the entire volume from the standpoint of scientific insight and philosophical depth. Readers seeking a subtle account of the interface between science and religion need look no further than Ruse’s essay in this volume. Following Ruse, there is a speculative essay by Simon Conway Morris that purports to see evidence of a cosmic teleology in the facts of evolutionary convergence.

The final essay in the volume is by Peter van Inwagen, who explores the issue of the compatibility of Darwinism with the argument from design. Like the essay by Michael Ruse, this essay exhibits a considerable degree of philosophical and theological sophistication, and like Ruse’s essay, it too will repay serious study. For van Inwagen, if unaided natural selection could produce the ordered diversity we see in the biological world, why could not a God (or some other intelligent being) desiring such diversity have used this same elegant mechanism? “Anyone who thinks that the history of terrestrial life is inconsistent with its being the vehicle by which God’s purposes have unfolded in time really should have something to say about how the history of life would look if it were the vehicle of God’s unfolding purposes” (p. 362). Perhaps, after all, one can have one’s cake and eat it. Maybe so, but we are a long way here from the hostility to modern science implicit in the work of creationists, intelligent design theorists and Biblical literalists. If van Inwagen is right, it may be possible after all to rise above the din generated by the clash of naïve scientism with naïve theology.